Naturalism and the First-Person Perspective

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Lynne Rudder Baker, Naturalism and the First-Person Perspective, Oxford University Press, 2013, 248pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780199914746.

Reviewed by Owen Flanagan, Duke University


The title of this book fits like a glove. Lynne Rudder Baker aims to show that naturalism cannot make room for such facts as that there are first-person experiences and perspectives. First person facts are items such as my experience of pain, which Baker calls rudimentary, and thoughts such as "I am glad I am a philosopher," which she calls robust because they contain a self-concept. Naturalism, according to Baker, denies that there are such facts and insists that such apparent facts be reduced or eliminated from a true view of reality. This cannot be done. Therefore, naturalism must go.

The book is divided into two parts. Part 1, consists of 5 chapters and is a relentless brief against naturalism. In Part 2, comprised of chapters 6-10, Baker sketches and explores the concept of person that she claims to save from naturalistic reduction or elimination in Part 1.

Chapter 1, "Varieties of Naturalism," offers distinctions among kinds of naturalism, ontological, epistemological, methodological, and a thin view that is utterly negative and simply says, "Just say 'No' to supernaturalism."[1] Baker's target is ontological naturalism or what she often calls scientific naturalism, which says that ontology "is exhausted by the entities and properties invoked by scientific theories" (5). We are told that some naturalists are disenchanted moral nihilists (Alex Rosenberg), others optimistic and morally and politically serious (Philip Kitcher); and that there is a divide between reductive and non-reductive naturalists. One might think that nonreductive naturalists can make room for first-person facts, but Baker thinks not. The reason is that "If naturalism is correct, then the world, at bottom, is wholly impersonal" (xxi). Furthermore, the cognitive sciences that seem to take first-properties seriously do not. At most cognitive science and the other human sciences take apparent first person facts to be just pragmatically useful sources of evidence, not really real (27).

Chapter 2, "On Naturalizing the First-Person Perspective," explores two strategies for naturalizing the first person perspective, reduction and elimination. "Scientific naturalism is true if and only if every apparent property is naturalized either by reduction or by elimination" (30). We are also introduced to the distinction between rudimentary and robust first-person perspectives.

Chapter 3, "Reductive Approaches to the First-Person Perspective," interprets John Perry and David Lewis as committed to reduction of the first person, and then offers some comments rather than sustained arguments that they fail. This offering of comments, rather than arguments, is a general weakness of the book. In many sections of most every chapter, Baker takes on some philosopher and writes a brief essentially positioning herself in relation to that thinler's view. But there is too much work left by naming the philosopher -- often a colleague -- and too little work done by close examination of a view or a claim. This feature of positioning causes trouble at the end of this chapter where we are told in a three page "A Comment on John Searle" that Searle's naturalism is unsatisfactory because it is oxymoronic to be an ontological naturalist and appeal to ontological subjectivity. Baker interprets Searle as a reductionist, but this will take more work since Searle, like me, and sometimes like Baker, insists that consciousness is a natural phenomenon. It comes with certain kinds of bodies. But conscious mental states are not reducible or eliminable in some impersonal language. Searle calls the view biological naturalism. I call it subjective realism.[2] Conscious mental states are brain states that have essentially an objective and a subjective side. Baker does not allow this sort of view, because according to her, naturalism requires that the first person has no ontological import. The chapter ends with a very weak reiteration of the claim from the Introduction that cognitive science does not really take first person facts seriously as facts. But many cognitive scientists are subjective realists. There really are experiences and there really are robust first-person facts. Consciousness, intentionality, and language evolved due to natural selection, and certain kinds of creatures have a variety of such first-person mental states. They play various kinds of causal roles.

Chapter 4, "Eliminative Approaches to the First-Person Perspective" takes Daniel Dennett and Thomas Metzinger as philosophers who attempt elimination of the first-person facts rather than reduction of them. One worry here is that Metzinger's eliminativism about the self is mostly a deconstruction of a certain view of personal identity, not really a full on eliminativism about robust first-person mental states. And, of course, Dennett is cagey about eliminativism, often insisting that some mental state attributions involve "real patterns."[3]

Chapter 5, "Arguments against First-Person Naturalization," reiterates Baker's constant refrain that "sciences are wholly impersonal or objective" (102). She casually considers an objection that keeps lurking to the effect that nonreductive naturalists like Hilary Kornblith, Kitcher, Searle, and this reviewer can say, and say truthfully, that sciences like cognitive science, cognitive neuroscience, intentional psychology, sociology, and anthropology are in fact ontologically committed to first-person ontology. Here Baker fixes terms so that ontological naturalists are not allowed to say this. Why? Because, ontological naturalists are committed to reduction or elimination of first-person properties, to a "wholly impersonal world."

Part 2 offers Baker's positive view. Chapter 6, "From the Rudimentary to the Robust Stage of the First-Person Perspective," explains the difference between conscious beings and self-conscious beings. All conscious beings have a rudimentary first-person perspective. Humans develop a robust first-person perspective, which requires a self-concept.

Chapter 7, "Is the Idea of the First-Person Perspective Coherent?" sketches several interesting positions to the effect that person is a primary kind such that "nothing that had person as its primary kind could cease to be a person and continue to exist" (147). "We are necessarily embodied, but we do not necessarily have the bodies that we have" (149). The survival or persistence of persons depends on robust first-personal facts. Non-human animals despite being subjects of experience, and being possessed of "rudimentary consciousness," have "third-personal persistence conditions" (148). This seems an odd, unwarranted move, since one would think that rudimentary consciousness just is having a first-person point of view that it is both irreducible and ineliminable, and that it is constitutive of the persistence of the dasein of, say, the chimpanzee that is the subject of that very conscious life.

Chapter 8, "A Metaphysical Framework for the First-Person Perspective," explains that first-person properties are dispositional; they involve capacities. Robust consciousness is genuinely novel. Chapter 9, "Agents, Artifacts, Moral Responsibility," provides an inventory of several features that distinguish persons, possessed of robust first-personal perspectives, and non-human animals possessed only of rudimentary consciousness, first and foremost moral responsibility. Chapter 10, "Natural Reality," concludes the book by endorsing what Baker calls "near-naturalism," which is "naturalistic in the weak sense of bracketing questions about anything supernatural" (p. 207). "Near naturalism" is non-reductive and not-eliminativist. Baker believes in emergence and downward causation. Unlike ontological naturalism, which imposes a "closure principle" by insisting that what there is, and all there is, is natural, Baker leaves open the possibility that there might be non-natural stuff.

A philosopher who wants to understand the contours of Baker's important contributions to metaphysics will do best to read the two dozen papers cited in Naturalism and the First-Person Perspective. The book is clearly written, but it is more of a wide-ranging statement of Baker's views on naturalism and the first-person than a careful working out of her views. The book is both too polemical and too chatty, sometimes letting names and conversations with colleagues serve in place of careful spelling out of a view. For all the heat spent criticizing naturalism, Baker holds a familiar position: non- reductive naturalism of a non-imperialistic sort. We are animals possessed of rudimentary consciousness and a variety of robust first personal capacities. The first personal facts are not reducible or eliminable to impersonal ones. As for the scope of naturalism, the imperialistic naturalist says that what there is and all there could possibly be is natural stuff. Here Baker endorses humility.

[1] In Owen Flanagan, "Varieties of Naturalism," in The Oxford Handbook of Religion and Science, eds. Philip Clayton and Zachary Simpson (2006), Oxford University Press, I offer a very long taxonomy of the varieties of naturalism. Naturalism, I have come to think, is not a helpful way of philosophically positioning oneself or one's opponents.

[2] John Searle (1992) The Rediscovery of Mind. MIT Press; Owen Flanagan (1992) Consciousness Reconsidered. MIT Press; Owen Flanagan (2002), The Problem of the Soul: Two Visions of Mind and How to Reconcile Them, Basic Books.

[3] Dennett, Daniel C. "Real patterns." The Journal of Philosophy 88 (1991): 27-51.