Naturalism Defeated? Essays on Plantinga's Evolutionary Argument Against Naturalism

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Beilby, James (ed.), Naturalism Defeated? Essays on Plantinga's Evolutionary Argument Against Naturalism, Cornell University Press, 2002, 283pp, $19.95 (pbk), ISBN 0-8014-8763-3.

Reviewed by John F. Post, Vanderbilt University


This collection of eleven critical essays, together with Plantinga’s replies, examines his evolutionary argument against naturalism (EAAN). All but one of the eleven are printed here for the first time, all are of high quality, and all receive Plantinga’s trademark treatment — rigorous, perceptive, thorough. In view of the numerous arguments, sub-arguments and observations advanced by the eleven against EAAN, his responses amount to a tour de force. It would take too long to sort through the point-counterpoint with a view to laying out the many interconnections, valuable though that would be. Instead, after a sketch of EAAN, I summarize some of the key objections raised by the eleven, together with Plantinga’s replies, then conclude with an objection of my own to what Plantinga calls the heart of his argument.

The volume’s editor, James Beilby, does a nice job in his Preface of providing a brief overview of EAAN. To begin with, “Plantinga claims that the objective conditional probability that we have reliable cognitive faculties [R], given naturalism [N] and evolutionary theory [E], is either low … or inscrutable” (this volume, vii). That is,

(1) P(R/N&E) is either low or inscrutable.

One of Plantinga’s reasons for (1), indeed what appears to be the crucial reason, is that whereas natural selection operates on actual behavior, naturalism is (basically) committed to materialism, and

it is extremely hard to see, from the perspective of materialism, how it could be that the content of a belief, the proposition that is associated with that belief as its content, plays a role in the causation of the behavior. Insofar as a belief enters the causal chain leading to behavior, it is by virtue of its neurophysiological properties, not its content (253).

This is so whether or not the proposition is true. Hence given that content can play no causal role, by N&E, the probability of content epiphenomenalism is high on N&E, which in turn implies that the probability that our cognitive belief-forming faculties are reliable is low on N&E, as Plantinga believes it is, though his argument requires only its inscrutability (11). In either case, (1) is true.

It follows that the reflective person S who accepts N&E, and who comes to realize that N&E implies the truth of (1), will have what Plantinga calls an alethic defeater for R — a defeater for the reliability of our cognitive faculties insofar as they are aimed directly at the production of true beliefs (209). Since these faculties are involved in all our epistemic enterprises, it follows further that S has a defeater for all of S’s beliefs, including N&E itself. One cannot rationally be both a naturalist and a believer in an evolutionary, natural-selective account of the provenance of our cognitive faculties. Plantinga adds, “[T]he conjunction of [N with E] is in a certain interesting way self-defeating or self-referentially incoherent” (2).

Beilby arranges the eleven essays in four parts, corresponding to what they target in Plantinga’s argument. The following is my summary, not altogether representative, of key objections raised by the eleven, along with Plantinga’s replies (some successful, some less so, in ways it would take too long to spell out here). The authors in Part I target assertion (1), arguing that Plantinga has not shown the probability of R on N&E to be either low or inscrutable. Thus William Ramsey argues that Plantinga “overlooks the most sensible way … to get clear on how truth can be a property of beliefs that bestows an advantage on cognitive systems” (16). Roughly, the best explanation of why the relevant sort of creature, when successful, finds food, avoids predators, spots a mate, is that it possesses accurate beliefs (or accurate “maps by which [to] steer”) as regards various objects’ location, trajectory and character. Plantinga’s reply is mainly that this pays insufficient attention to the problem of whether, for the naturalist, belief can be “causally efficacious by way of its content” (258), as it must be if its being true is to enhance fitness. If the content is not causally efficacious, or if the probability of content epiphenomenalism is high, as Plantinga believes it is, or at least inscrutable, then P(R/N&E) is correspondingly low or inscrutable and assertion (1) is true.

Jerry Fodor argues that there is a plausible historical scenario according to which our minds were selected because their cognitive mechanisms produced, by and large, adaptive true beliefs (36-40). Plantinga’s reply, in addition to the longish passage quoted above (from p. 253), is that “attempts to show how it could be that content does enter [the relevant] causal chain have unanimously come to grief” (253). Unless the naturalist can show how to close this crucial gap between content and causation of behavior on which natural selection can work, the probability of content epiphenomenalism is high and that of R is low. Clearly, even if Plantinga is wrong about such epiphenomenalism, naturalists have some explaining to do.

Evan Fales argues that Plantinga has not demonstrated that the reliability of our cognitive faculties is improbable, given Neo-Darwinism, and emphasizes, rightly, that “if Plantinga’s argument fails here, then he will not have shown that [N&E] is probabilistically incoherent” (45). Once more Plantinga invokes the threat of content epiphenomenalism, challenging naturalists to explain how the content of a belief, the relevant associated proposition, is not causally impotent — how beliefs are causally efficacious not only by way of their purely neurophysiological properties but semantically as well (263). Furthermore, naturalists must explain how the beliefs are adaptive in virtue of being true, if the explanation is to be relevant to whether our cognitive faculties are reliable. And yet, according to Plantinga,

it isn’t even remotely plausible to think that the content of belief is somehow obliged to supervene [on neurophysiology (and the environment)] in such a way as to be true. Only magical thinking … would lead to that conclusion (264).

However, I believe that a number of the needed threads of a successful explanation run separately through the essays of Part I, threads that need only be woven together with a further important strand to fill the explanatory gap Plantinga finds it so hard to conceive being filled. I will return to this matter of a missing strand, after summarizing key objections to EAAN from the remaining Parts II-IV.

In Part II, the target is Plantinga’s claim that if S believes both N&E and the implied (1), then S has a defeater for R. Michael Bergmann suggests to the contrary that one can find in Thomas Reid the resources for a commonsense defense of naturalism against EAAN. The gist is that “(i) a belief can be noninferentially justified … and … (ii) among our noninferentially justified beliefs are a good number of our commonsense beliefs” (63), including R (87-89). Plantinga agrees that “we do indeed, just as Reid said, believe R noninferentially, and this belief, held in that basic way, has a good deal of warrant for us” (230). But even though R has a lot of proper-function rationality and warrant, it does not follow that S has no defeater for R. Furthermore, S does have a purely alethic rationality defeater for R, namely (1), which defeats the claim that our cognitive faculties are successfully aimed at the production of true beliefs (209, 231).

Ernest Sosa draws on insufficiently appreciated features of Descartes’ epistemology to argue that while “[i]ssues of circularity do arise as to how we can rationally and knowledgeably adopt [an epistemically propitious] view about our own epistemic powers,” nonetheless, “these problems are not exclusive to naturalism.” Hence it is open to you as a naturalist to “develop a view of yourself and your surroundings that shows your situation to be epistemically propitious” (102). Plantinga replies,

The problem, as I see it, is not that the naturalist can’t think up a story according to which R holds for us; no doubt he can. The problem is rather that he has a defeater for R; and this defeater can’t be sidestepped, finessed, defeated or deflected by constructing a story according to which R holds anyway (245-246).

So the naturalist is confronted once more with the challenge of explaining how P(R/N&E) is not after all low or inscrutable, by explaining how the truth of a belief can be causally efficacious in such a way as to enhance fitness.

James Van Cleve, drawing on a solution he explores to the problem of the Cartesian circle, argues that even if probability thesis (1) is true, this need not deliver an undefeated defeater to R. Furthermore, even if one has a defeater for R, why does it follow that one has a defeater for everything? What general, non-ad-hoc principle underlies this inference (121-123)? Plantinga’s reply is similar to his responses to Bergmann and Sosa, but adds helpfully that if a general principle is wanted, it is that

if you have considered the question whether a given source of information or belief is reliable, and have an undefeated defeater for the belief that it is, then you have a defeater for any belief such that you think it originates (solely) from that source…. [I]n acquiring an undefeated defeater for R, I get a defeater for all of my beliefs (241).

It follows that insofar as (1) is an undefeated defeater for N&E, one cannot rationally be both a naturalist and a believer in an evolutionary, natural-selective account of the provenance of our cognitive faculties.

In Part III, the target is the conditionalization problem. If (1) is to be a defeater for R, we need to know what information, exactly, Plantinga is conditionalizing on when he claims that the conditional probability of R on N&E is low or inscrutable. Tim O’Connor argues that the naturalist may conditionalize on information about the proper function of our cognitive faculties. Thus while R is not indefeasible, “It is plausible, given [N&E], that the naturalist’s unshaken confidence in R reflects our cognitive design plan, stemming from a module aimed at truth… . [Indeed] there couldn’t be a defeater for R,” since were there one, that “would lead one to abandon the attempt to form true beliefs,” and “it surely could not be part of a design plan with this very end” (131-132). Plantinga’s reply resembles his reply to Bergmann: the reflective naturalist would still have a purely alethic defeater for R, since on N&E “it isn’t likely that the … purpose (if any) of [the reflective naturalist’s] cognitive faculties is that of producing true beliefs” (238).

Richard Otte thinks Plantinga’s argument “ignores other information we have that would make R likely” (135). Conditionalizing on additional information has the effect of “narrowing down the worlds we are interested in,” so that as we narrow down, “R becomes more and more likely until it is certain… . The problem is deciding which [range of worlds] to use in Plantinga’s argument,” hence which probability (142). Otte suggests that we can non-question-beggingly conditionalize on our experience, looking only at worlds consistent with our experience (143). Plantinga agrees that there is a problem here about what is “the appropriate body of propositions to conditionalize on in this context” (267). But he goes on to argue that Otte’s proposal is unconvincing; having already acquired a defeater for R in (1), no amount of (further) experience, as construed by Otte, changes that fact.

In the final Part IV the target is the nature of defeaters. William Talbott argues that “Plantinga has misunderstood the role of undercutting defeaters in reasoning,” and this leads Plantinga “to laud as rational a kind of cognitive rigidity that is far from epistemically desirable” (153). No objectionable circularity is involved “when our cognitive faculties … judge themselves to be reliable on the basis of the total evidence available, and there is no other basis available for judging them to be unreliable” (157-158). Plantinga thanks Talbott for having “led me to see something important about defeaters” (225). But in EAAN it is the reliability of all of S’s cognitive faculties that is in question, and once the naturalist S has been shown that (1) is an alethic rationality defeater for the reliability of them all, so that S now has a global doubt as to their reliability, it follows that no objectionable circularity is involved in concluding that this doubt extends to all S’s other beliefs, including not only N&E but any beliefs to which S might now appeal in order to defeat the defeater for R (227-230).

Trenton Merricks points out “that, in general, inferences from low or inscrutable conditional probability to defeat are unjustified,” unless some explanation is given of why, in this instance, it is nonetheless justified. The burden is thus on Plantinga to supply some such explanation (167), and his attempt to do so by way of various analogies fails. For, they are not “epistemic analogues of the situation in which the devotee of N&E finds herself,” and when they are tweaked into being such analogues, “they are no longer cases in which it is obvious that R … has a defeater” (174). Merricks then suggests, in light of a remark by Plantinga elsewhere, that the claim that (1) is a defeater for R could be defended if Plantinga were to advance an appropriate general principle to the effect that “R’s low or inscrutable probability on a claim relevantly related to the origin of one’s faculties implies that that claim is a defeater for R” (175). In reply, Plantinga of course does just that. Warrant for R, he says,

requires that the segment of the cognitive establishment producing the belief in question be aimed at the production of true belief. If my cognitive establishment has been produced by the undirected processes of current evolutionary science, however, the … purpose … of my cognitive faculties, if they have a purpose, will be that of producing beliefs that are … fitness-enhancing, not true beliefs (250-251).

Yet again the naturalist faces the challenge of explaining how the truth of a belief can be causally efficacious in such a way as to enhance fitness.

William Alston argues that the claim that P(R/N&E) is low is poorly supported; if, instead, it is inscrutable, this has no clear relevance to the claim that (1) is a defeater for N&E. All this

leaves Plantinga’s argument … without the intended force. It would still be possible for him to argue that one who insists on holding on to N&E cannot preserve internal rationality except by giving up R. And perhaps that would give him the heart of what he is after (202).

Plantinga replies, “That is indeed the heart of what I am after” (275). The heart of his argument for what he is after is that N&E does not support the commonsense belief R that our cognitive faculties are reliable, indeed N&E makes it “extremely hard to see … how it could be that the content of a belief … plays a role in the causation of the behavior” (253; cf. 272); there is a crucial gap in the naturalist’s explanatory scheme.

Thus, after the dust has settled, Plantinga’s underlying strategy proves to be very old: point to a stubborn, strategic explanatory gap, argue that (probably) they’ll never be able to close it, then suggest a theistic explanation that does a better job (say by closing it without landing in self-referential incoherence, among other things). Not that Plantinga is invoking a God-of-the-gaps. Rather, he is advancing an anti-naturalism-of-the-gaps. Like all such explanatory-gap arguments, this one is vulnerable to, among other things, a kind of meta-inductive argument: in the past when the science on which naturalism draws was criticized for failing to explain this or that, the gap was eventually closed (or shown to be bogus); what was regarded as an impossibility, or at least an improbability, proved instead to be a lack of imagination or knowledge. Why not here, especially since naturalism continues to be a robustly progressing research program?

Indeed, we may not have to wait so long for a successful explanation of how the content of a belief can be causally efficacious. Some naturalists believe it already exists, in the work of Ruth Millikan, though you’d never know from the present volume; Plantinga and his critics breathe not a word about her work — the missing strand, as I see it.1 She gives an imaginative, rigorous account of how the content of a belief — indeed its truth — can and often does play an appropriate role in the causal chain leading to behavior, hence can and does enhance fitness. Yet Plantinga proceeds as though the naturalist’s resources are exhausted by the accounts he considers — essentially those that are either eliminativist about content or would have content enter the causal chain by supervening on neurophysiology (and the environment). It is against this background that he says “it isn’t even remotely plausible to think that the content of belief is somehow obliged to supervene [on neurophysiology (and the environment)] in such a way as to be true” (264). But why must a naturalist think this? Millikan’s account relies on no such supervenience thesis. Rather, the truth of a belief plays a role in the causal chain leading to behavior without the belief’s content supervening on neurophysiological properties (and the environment).

It thus appears that Plantinga “ignores other information we have that would make R likely,” to quote Otte again (135) — information about Millikan’s or related accounts and their plausibility if not their success. Unless or until someone shows that neither Millikan’s nor any other extant account not covered by Plantinga plugs the explanatory gap, his EAAN “will not even get off the ground” (Otte, 135). For as Plantinga himself says, the other parts of EAAN are “dialectically posterior” to this question of the probability of R on N&E (269). The more reason, then, to take a good look at Millikan’s and related accounts. In the house of naturalism are many mansions, to be ignored at our peril.


1. See especially Chapters 3-6 of her White Queen Psychology (Cambridge, MA: MIT Press, 1993). Plantinga considers Millikan briefly in Warrant and Proper Function (New York: Oxford University Press, 1993), 201-204, 206 and 210 — but only to reject her account of proper function insofar as it might contribute, if unintentionally, to an analysis of the common notion. I argue that such analysis is question-beggingly beside the point for a revisionary naturalist like her, in “From Is to Ought: Another Way,” §§5.2-5.5 and n33, available at