Naturalism, Realism, and Normativity

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Hilary Putnam, Naturalism, Realism, and Normativity, Mario De Caro (ed.), Harvard University Press, 2016, 238pp., $49.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780674659698.

Reviewed by Stathis Psillos, University of Athens


Hilary Putnam died on March 13, 2016. In 2013 he wrote: "It had better be the case that we can learn from dead philosophers, 'cause we're all gonna be dead!" (92). Well, Putnam was in constant dialogue with many dead (as well as living) philosophers. His intellectual career, as is amply testified by the present volume, was characterized by an honest and genuine attempt to refine and revise his philosophical positions so that they reflect more accurately his changing views. Putnam was not afraid of changing philosophical views either as a result of arguments produced by dead and living philosophers or as a result of fresh empirical findings. His corpus is a philosophical goldmine. I doubt that there has been any philosopher who interacted with his work without being deeply influenced by him.

This book has 13 chapters and an informative introduction by the editor, Mario De Caro. The essays span 15 years, from 2001 to 2015. The final two essays are mostly autobiographical: they recount Putnam's philosophical development, especially when it comes to some of his main positions in the philosophy of language. The rest of the essays aim to make clear where the 21st-century Putnam stood vis-à-vis important philosophical debates and issues.

One important element that runs through is Putnam's attempt to explain why he changed his mind on important issues such as realism as well as to clarify (against actual and possible misunderstandings) which of his former views he revised and which he didn't. As he explicitly states, after the Dewey lectures in 1994 (which appeared as The Threefold Cord: Mind, Body and World, 1999), he abandoned internal realism because he jettisoned verificationism. But he never went back to Metaphysical realism (with a capital 'M'), though he retained realism as a "world-involving" view. Putnam also notes that by abandoning verificationism, he did not thereby abandon conceptual relativity. That's a constant of his thought.

A significant theme (represented in many of the essays) is Putnam's attempt to explain what conceptual relativity implies and what it does not. It does not imply that we make up the world. As he says: "I've never accepted Nelson Goodman's idea that we 'make' the world" (91). Nor does it imply relativism about truth. He says: "descriptive statements (note the restriction!) are connected to the world via the reference of the names and predicates that they contain, and reference is a relation to things (and sets of things, and sets of ordered pairs of things, etc.) in the world" (91). Yet, it does imply that "we renegotiate -- and are forced to renegotiate -- our notion of reality as our language and our life develop" (88). What exactly does that mean? Putnam takes a cue from Jennifer Case's idea of "optional languages". The idea, as I understand it, is this. We "should not think of ourselves as having one conceptual scheme" (87). That is to say, in our attempt to understand the world around us, there are various contexts in which we are faced with the need to extend our language in new ways. To be sure, we already have a language, but within it we can "introduce an indefinite number of conceptual schemes or optional languages (and as that language develops, there will be the possibility of still more)".

Take, for instance, the example Putnam made famous. Suppose there is a world in which there are three individuals x1, x2, x3. According to some mereologists, there are in fact seven things or entities or objects, namely, x1, x2, x3, x1 + x2, x1 + x3, x2 + x3, x1 + x2 + x3. But antimereologists admit of only three individuals as objects that really exist in that world. The question then might be: who are right and who are wrong? Putnam thinks that here we are faced with a choice of optional language. Hence this is not a matter of being right or wrong. However, this admission does not imply that we "relativise existence" to language (84). Instead, "what we have to do is make clear which optional language we are speaking". Still, and this is the crux of the matter, "we must not think of all the optional ontologies as if they might be simply pooled" (87). So it's not as if we are to choose, from among independently existing optional ontologies, the right one. As he put it: "According to 'conceptual relativity' there is only the question of a choice of an 'optional language' here" (86).

To avoid unwanted consequences, Putnam insists that the need for an optional language is not arbitrary. Reality plays a role by us to "recognize that we need, for example, at least one optional language in which we can describe (for example) quantum reality" (87). But 'at least one' does not imply 'exactly one'. How then are conflicts between optional languages dealt with? Putnam, to be sure, talks of optional languages that are "(not just empirically equivalent, but) explanatorily equivalent", where by the latter he means that "the translation of any explanation of a physical phenomenon provided by one theory is a perfectly good explanation of the same phenomenon in the language of the other theory (but one that is very different, at least at 'face value')" (153). In cases such as this, no explanatory lacuna arises from adopting one instead of the other optional language.

Putnam insists that one can adopt this kind of conceptual relativity without changing the meaning of 'exists'. He sides with Charles Travis and the claim that "a word may have the same meaning in different contexts even though the truth-evaluable content of what you say by using that word may vary with the context" (93). 'Exists' need not change its meaning even though "the truth-evaluable content of what we say using the word 'exist' varies a great deal, and in some contexts it is perfectly right to say that mereological sums exist, and in other contexts it is right to say there aren't really such things as mereological sums, that's 'just one way of talking'". (93) The moral of all this is that Putnam rejects the claim that "there's just one correct way of using 'exist' and that way determines a unique answer to the question 'are mereological sums included in the furniture of the universe or not?'". As he put it "That's the sort of 'ontology' that I wrote an obituary for" (94).

Admitting conceptual relativity is independent of 'internal realism'. Hence, repudiating the latter leaves the former intact. In fact, Putnam readily acknowledges that he was mistaken about internal realism. He now goes back to metaphysical realism (with a small 'm'). He says:

one can perfectly well be a metaphysical realist (as, perhaps to your surprise, I now admit to being) in the simple sense of believing that there is a real world that is largely independent of our mental workings, beliefs, or concepts, and many truths about that world that outrun what we can possibly verify, without denying the existence of the phenomenon I call 'conceptual relativity'. (153)

So Putnam's adoption of metaphysical realism (alongside the thought that there is no one single 'explanatorily complete' way to describe the independently existing world) came with his rejection of internal realism, the latter being the claim that "what truth amounts to is justification under epistemically ideal conditions" (153). In the present volume Putnam makes a special effort to show how deep his disagreement with verificationism has been. In chapter 6, he revisits Hans Reichenbach's anti-verificationist empiricism and unveils the key pitfall of traditional verificationism, which relied on one's own experiences as the basis for verification.

The problem with traditional verificationism was how to justify inferences to unperceived or unperceivable things from whatever is (or can be) perceived by the subject. Putnam is rightly impressed by the following point made by Reichenbach in his Experience and Prediction:

The insufficiency of a positivist language in which talk of events after my death is construed as a device for predicting my experiences while I am alive is revealed as soon as we try to use it for the rational reconstruction of the thought processes underlying actions concerned with events after our death, such as expressed in the example of [purchasing] life insurance policies. (cited, 112)

According to Putnam, this kind of point -- that unless you accept that there are things unobserved-by-you and existing independently of you and your own experiences, it does not make sense to buy life insurance -- suggests that a realist understanding of language is imperative. As Putnam put it later (120), the proper understanding of language should not be justificationist: there is more to understanding a sentence than being justified in asserting it on the basis on one's own experiences. This more is what makes this sentence true.

In his discussion of modern verificationism -- as expounded by Michael Dummett -- Putnam concedes that it avoids the "Scylla of solipsism" which threatened traditional verificationism (121). Dummett is clear, Putnam says, that justification is collective (social) and not individualistic. Still, he thinks that Dummett's verificationism is unstable. Take, for instance, statements about the past. Dummett thinks that they are true insofar as they are directly verifiable by witnesses at the time in which what is reported by these statements happened; and that, as Dummett put it, "while that "direct" verification may be transmitted to us via a trace, it counts as a verification whether it is transmitted or not" (cited, 125). According to Putnam, this kind of move is unsatisfactory because it leaves unaccounted for how "a statement about the past may be true even though no testimony is available" to those who assert it (126).

Putnam extends his critique of verificationism to Crispin Wright's 'superassertibility'. His chief point is that an evidence-transcendent truth is not malignant and that Wright's attempt to understand truth by means of various conditional statements which connect truth-ascription to a statement with the obtaining of "sufficiently good circumstances" for its appraisal fails for the same reason that Carnap's reduction sentences failed to account for the meaning of theoretical terms (130-1). As Putnam put it, though Wright introduces his conditional "as a reduction sentence for the predicate 'true,' one which partially specifies its extension . . . it leaves the extension of that predicate undetermined in every case in which the 'sufficiently good circumstances' do not obtain" (131).

But if a justificationist conception of truth is abandoned (even in the form of "idealized justification" that Putnam accepted in his internal realist period (122)), is the Scylla of solipsism to be avoided only by falling into the "Charybdis of metaphysical realism"? (124) -- (the capital 'M' is implied!). Putnam argues that he avoids both the Scylla and the Charybdis by taking it that a "sufficiently good epistemic situation" is a "world-involving" situation: "On my alternative picture (as opposed to Dummett's), the world was allowed to determine whether I actually am in a sufficiently good epistemic situation or whether I only seem to myself to be in one" (123).

Does that mean that Putnam adopts a realist conception of truth?  He's upfront in what he rejects: "Truth is not the same thing as warranted assertability under ideal conditions. 'Realism and Reason' was wrong" (27). He also rejects deflationism since the latter fails to account for the "interdependence of truth and reference" (37). Deflationism is the view that disquotation is all there is to truth (36) but for Putnam it is an "illusion that disquotation does not presuppose the relation of reference" (38). As he put it: "there is all the difference in the world between accepting a disquotation principle and accepting the claim that such a principle captures completely what one has to know about truth" (36). So, positively put, truth requires reference. In fact, the bulk of chapter 1 aims to show that Tarski's conception of truth presupposes an account of reference and that this very notion of reference is not reduced to any "nonsemantical notion" (34). More specifically, Putnam argues against the view that it is enough for reference that there is the right causal connection between word and object. Still, reference (though irreducible to causal terms) "is a relation to things . . . in the world" (96).

All this does not lead him to a correspondence theory of truth. His problem is not that there is no correspondence between what a sentence says of the world and what the world is like. Rather, his problem is that there are too many correspondences; there is simply no "one and the same kind of correspondence at stake no matter what the empirical statement is, and no matter what the occasion of its utterance may be" (95). The example he offers is instructive. The statement 'This piece of beef weighs one pound' may 'correspond to reality' "by the standard of correspondence appropriate to a butcher shop, but be extremely wrong by the standard of laboratory science" (95). Putnam acknowledges the difficulty in offering an account of truth which does justice "simultaneously both to the unity of the notion [truth] and to the plurality of the correctness-conditions that go with it and give it content". Truth, at least when it comes to descriptive-empirical statements, is world-involving; but perhaps not much more can be said of it.

Given the tight connection between reference and truth, can more be said about this world-involving but irreducible-to-non-semantic-terms conception of reference? Putnam insists that the claim that "reference is a relation between linguistic items and worldly objects" is "essential part of my own realism" (24). But can more be said about this relation which does not make one adopt "scientific naturalism"? Putnam is adamant, for instance, that the word 'rabbit' (or the word 'gavagai' for that matter) does not refer to undetached rabbit parts, since "no biological account describes the environment as containing undetached rabbit parts, and undetached rabbit parts do not figure in any scientific explanation in perceptual psychology either" (40). But doesn't this imply that he's a scientific naturalist? Putnam resists this conclusion and here is where his "liberal naturalism" comes into play. As he explains, being a naturalist, he rejects "all appeals to supernatural entities in philosophy" (22). But being "liberal" does not imply that he's merely an anti-reductionist. It implies a certain way to view science. In offering "natural-scientific explanations", science is not committed to offering physicalist explanations. What is more, science is not value-free. Judgements of reasonableness and unreasonableness, within science, rest on "epistemic values" and are not confined to "checking predictions" (61). These judgements are not "outside the domain of rational criticism". Not only can reason not be naturalized, but it is presupposed by science and the activity of scientists (42). "Science depends on what is not fully scientific at every point" (43).

Though Putnam rejected "panscientism", viz., the view "that philosophical problems are fated, in the end, to be resolved by the progress of the natural sciences, and that the best the philosopher can do is to anticipate that progress, and suggest how the sciences can solve them" (214), he never renounced scientific realism (91). Nor did he waver in his commitment to the no-miracles argument for realism: "as I first said in 1975, scientific realism, in this sense, is the only philosophy that doesn't make the success of science a miracle" (215).

His commitment to scientific realism has been instrumental in his taking an anti-reductionist view in ethics. Ethical principles, for Putnam, are not the products of Darwinian evolution. For him ethics has both an evolutionary history and a cultural history (57). The cultural history is best seen in the light of the fact that "ethical codes" are far from eternal; instead they are changeable by being subject to "rational challenge". At least part of the grounds for the rational challenge of ethical codes comes from science and the idea that claims about human nature "are empirical claims that can be challenged and investigated" (60). And this requires taking a realist stance towards science. For Putnam it is not an accident that the "the valorization of equality" in the Enlightenment came with "the valorization of the new post-Galilean science" and its reliance on empirical evidence.

The final major theme of the collection is Putnam's philosophy of perception. Putnam distances himself from John McDowell's "minimal empiricism" by taking seriously William James's idea that in experience "sensations and apperceptive ideas fuse . . . so intimately that you can[not] tell where one begins and the other ends" (cited, 147). Apperception is the recognition of what one is perceiving and it involves concepts. Hence "apperceptions are conceptually shaped, and they can justify judgments" (149). Accordingly, the "tribunal" before which all our beliefs have to stand is not sense impressions but apperceptions. As Putnam sums up his position, "If 'minimal empiricism' insists otherwise, then 'minimal empiricism"' is too empiricist. Apperceptions are the tribunal, not sensations" (151).

For those who are familiar with Putnam's work, this volume will sum up his ultimate stance on most of the issues he dealt with throughout his many and diverse philosophical endeavours. For those less familiar with Putnam's work, it will offer an overview of his (multiple) philosophical locations in the rather complex (and ever-changing) philosophical landscape he was very artfully painting. All philosophers have something to gain by reading this book.