Naturalism without Mirrors

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Huw Price, Naturalism without Mirrors, Oxford University Press, 2011, 336pp., $49.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780195084337.

Reviewed by Willem deVries, University of New Hampshire


This book deserves the attention of anyone working in contemporary metaphysics or philosophy of language. The author is an Australian who is moving this fall to the Bertrand Russell Professorship at Cambridge University. All but one of the fourteen essays have been previously published. They are well-structured and clearly written, but the type is small and the essays are packed with argument, so the book is a dense read. The author admits that there is repetition across the essays, since they were independently concocted elaborations of different aspects of his philosophical naturalism.

There is a single "big picture" view in the essays here, a linguistically oriented pragmatism that is deeply anti-metaphysical. The individual essays supply different pieces of the detail work supporting Price's view. Price describes (or should I say expresses) his position as pragmatism, more particularly as a global expressivism combined with functional pluralism, and argues that it dissolves the so-called 'location' or 'placement' problems that metaphysicians worry endlessly over. The centerpiece of the position is a rejection of what Price calls "representationalism," which is the claim that the semantic relations, meaning, reference, and truth (or true of), are substantive relations that impose significant requirements on our best theory of the world and its constituents. Local expressivisms deny that utterances in some limited domain -- say, moral talk -- are true or false or 'descriptive', and claim they must be understood as having a distinctive function in our interactions. Global expressivism essentially denies that the distinctions between truth-evaluable and non-truth-evaluable, descriptive and non-descriptive, fact-stating and non-fact-stating can really bear any weight: all utterances must be looked at through the lens of their function in our interactions, not the metaphysics of their semantic relations. Such functions are manifold and several can be in play simultaneously.

Price's naturalism is "without mirrors" because the rejection of representationalism is a rejection of the idea that thought or language mirrors the world in such a way that we can read off significant ontological or metaphysical truths from the structure of language or thought. Language is not a mirror of nature. Price thus stands in general solidarity with Dewey, Wittgenstein, Rorty, and Brandom.

Once one understands the dialectic that Price believes generates placement problems, it is easy to see why he takes his approach to dissolving them. Suppose one has a general commitment to some synoptic philosophical program, say, naturalism or empiricism. Given virtually any such program, there will be domains of common discourse that seem to sit uneasily within the program. In the case of a naturalist or empiricist program, for instance, Price points to the 4 M's -- Morality, Modality, Meaning, and the Mental -- as particularly problematic. Representationalism assumes that if these domains of discourse make sense, if they are respectable and ineliminable parts of any adequate worldview, if they can contain truths about reality, there must be some corresponding domain of objects and properties referred to or meant that such discourse is true of. Via the representationalist assumption, a concern originally about the structure and function of different parts of language leads to a metaphysical worry about the fundamental structure of reality. Call this the "semantic ladder" that takes us from linguistic concerns down to worldly ontology. As long as one clings to representationalism, one will be committed to (or to explaining away) the existence of objects that, except to the rabid Platonist, seem admittedly queer.

Price wants to block the semantic ladder by rejecting representationalism altogether. This move does not excuse the naturalist from worrying about how discourse about Morality, Modality, Meaning, and the Mental (and we can throw in a fifth M, Mathematics, for good measure) fits with our so-called common, 'descriptive' discourse. But these worries call for an elaboration of linguistic theory, not metaphysics, and here Price proposes his global expressivism cum functional pluralism as the proper form such a linguistic theory should take. His expressivism takes inspiration from earlier expressivist theories concerning, e.g., morality or meaning. These theories tried to avoid uncomfortable metaphysical claims about values and meanings by rejecting the notion that claims in these domains, unlike the claims in ordinary or scientific descriptive discourse, are representational. Rather, they play a distinctive, non-descriptive function in our language, and when we see them in that light, we can no longer take seriously questions about the metaphysical status of their supposed objects. Such locallyexpressivist theories reach the height of their sophistication, Price thinks, in Simon Blackburn's quasi-realism.

But Price thinks local expressivisms like quasi-realism are untenable. There are pressures that force them towards a global expressivism. Price claims, for instance, that semantic minimalism (aka deflationism, the denial of representationalism) provides an argument for global expressivism. This runs contrary to the belief of a number of philosophers (e.g., Crispin Wright, John McDowell), who think that deflationism is incompatible with expressivism. These philosophers reason that expressivism is a form of non-cognitivism, which is often described as the thesis that the relevant kind of claims (e.g., moral claims) are not truth-evaluable and are thus not descriptive. But semantic minimalism, which takes semantic terms like 'truth' to be sufficiently explained by characterizing their function (e.g., via a disquotational theory, a prosentential theory, or Price's own 'convenient friction' theory (see Chapter 8)), makes truth-evaluability cheap and easy. In its simplest form, the argument is this: If minimalist truth is all there is, then anything embeddable in a T-sentence has truth conditions. Moral claims are so embeddable. So moral claims are truth-evaluable, as the cognitivist claims.

But this argument is "wrongheaded," according to Price. Expressivisms make two claims: (1) A negative claim that the terms or propositions in the relevant domain of discourse lack some semantic feature; they are non-referential, non-descriptive, or not truth-apt. (2) A positive claim that offers an alternative account of the functions of the language in question; it expresses or projects certain attitudes of the speaker. Semantic minimalism damages the negative claim by undercutting the notion that there is a significant distinction between descriptive and nondescriptive language, but it does nothing to threaten the positive attempt to explain the discourse in question via its expressive function. The proper conclusion, in Price's view, is to abandon the localism, admit that the cognitivism/noncognitivism distinction as characterized above is theoretically insignificant, but hold on to the positive claim: the proper way to account for various domains of language is via their various functions.

There is another element of Price's view that now needs to be mentioned, his quietism in matters metaphysical and semantic. Quietism about a particular vocabulary amounts to rejection of that vocabulary for purposes of philosophical (or scientific) theory. (It need not be rejected for other purposes.) Queried about mind, morality, etc., the quietist will answer by the lights of folk wisdom -- she will say it is false that murder is permissible and true that normal adult humans have minds. Thus, the quietist speaks with the folk under ordinary conditions. If, however, the focus turns from ordinary discourse to theory and one asks "Are moral claims really true?" or "Do values really exist?" the quietist will demur from engaging the question. That is, the quietist will say neither "Yes, moral values really exist!" nor "No, moral values do not really exist!" Instead, she will start a discussion of the function of moral discourse.

Quietism is important to Price, because Paul Boghossian has argued that deflationism is self-refuting when applied to sentences containing the semantic terms themselves. If deflationism is a position within linguistic theory, then the semantic terms are legitimate theoretical terms. Price answers by distinguishing between (A) denying (in one's theoretical voice) that ascriptions of semantic properties have semantic properties; and (B) saying nothing (in one's theoretical voice) about whether ascriptions of semantic properties have semantic properties -- that is, employing a different theoretical vocabulary to say what one wants about such ascriptions. While deflationism is inconsistent with (A) (an active rejection of semantic terms), it is consistent with (B) (a passive rejection of the claim that ascriptions of semantic properties have semantic properties).

Price offers as an analogy a Good Darwinian's passive rejection of God-talk: In her theoretical voice, the Good Darwinian neither affirms nor denies that God is responsible for the variety of species; she offers a reasonable and confirmable account of a mechanism that does account for the variety of species, and never mentions God at all. Price's pragmatism has to offer us an account of semantic terminology, since such vocabulary is clearly a part of any human language. But Price denies that this account will be couched in semantic terminology itself. Rather, in his view, such an account will be a piece of anthropology couched in terms of the pragmatic function of such discourse in the human community. According to Price, the relevant function will be an expressive function, not any representational function. An example of such an approach is Price's own treatment of truth as "convenient friction," here in essay 8 and in his 1988 book.[1]

Price's quietism is anti-metaphysical, but not a rejection of ontology as such, for anthropological theories of linguistic behavior clearly have (naturalistic) ontological presuppositions themselves. Price willingly accepts the ontological commitments tied to the practice of theorizing (from sideways-on, as McDowell might say) about linguistic behavior. But Price's view frees the theoretician of language from having to inherit all the apparent ontological commitments internal to the languages studied.

Price thinks that most naturalists in the past century or so have misdirected their efforts. They combined naturalism's claim that the sciences are ontologically and/or epistemologically authoritative with representationalism, climbed down the semantic ladder, and wasted time and energy on metaphysical solutions to the location problems generated. They believed that "The object of each kind of talk is an aspect of the world-as-studied-by-science, or else nothing at all" (186). Price calls this "object naturalism." He opposes to it his own subject naturalism. This is the view that philosophy needs to begin with what science tells us about ourselves. We are natural creatures, and anything that conflicts with this must be abandoned. Price identifies this as the naturalism of Hume and Nietzsche, and he argues that real naturalism is subject naturalism. More exactly, he argues for two specific claims concerning the relation of subject- and object-naturalism:

The Priority Thesis: Subject naturalism is theoretically prior to object naturalism, because the latter depends on validation from a subject naturalist perspective (186).

Thus, if the presuppositions of object naturalism are suspect from the self-reflective scientific standpoint endorsed by subject naturalism, then we have reason to reject object naturalism.

Invalidity Thesis: There are strong reasons for doubting whether object naturalism deserves to be 'validated' -- whether its presuppositions do survive subject natural scrutiny (187).

Thus, in Price's view, as in Hume's, the primary form of philosophy is philosophical anthropology.

I've traced the general outlines of Price's anti-metaphysical pragmatism here, and thus left open a number of more specific questions. Price responds to numerous objections and alternatives in various essays in the book. Expressivist or non-factualist theories about various domains of discourse were in their heyday in the '50s and '60s, until Geach and Searle mounted arguments that non-factualist treatments cannot account for uses in embedded contexts, e.g., in conditionals. Price answers these arguments in Essay 3, "Semantic Realism and the Frege Point," which includes a response to reductionism as well. In Essay 4, "Two Paths to Pragmatism," he compares his pragmatism to the kind of pragmatism (defended by Mark Johnston and Crispin Wright) that builds on the notion of a response-dependent property. In several places he contrasts his view with both Blackburn's quasi-realism and Frank Jackson's analytic metaphysics: Blackburn is a near ally, while Jackson exemplifies the kind of analytic metaphysics Price wants to kill off. Price also argues in several places that Wittgenstein shares his functional pluralism. Carnap's distinction between internal and external questions about linguistic frameworks is revived and defended, and pop-Quinean metaphysics is distinguished from the genuine (anti-metaphysical) article. There is plenty of meaty philosophy here.

But I must admit that I am not thoroughly sold on Price's anti-metaphysicalism. It is true that the Good Darwinian simply never mentions God, either positively or negatively, in explaining the origin of species, but, when asked outright whether God had a hand in the variety of species, the Good Darwinian has a right to respond "Je n'avais pas besoin de cette hypothèse-là." As far as I can see, although Price acknowledges that there are boundaries to realms of discourse, so that there are things one can and things one cannot say using the vocabulary of semantics, Price's view makes it very difficult to talk about just what those boundaries are, what's in and what's out. It is crucial for him that we distinguish our theoretical voice, which, in linguistics, will never use semantic vocabulary, from our non-theoretical voice(s), which are not so constrained. But I'm not sure how that distinction is to be drawn. Why isn't representationalism (part of) a theory (even if a bad one) about how and why language works? What do I say to the casual inquirer who asks whether the claims of current linguistic theory are true and complains when I simply start another conversation?

There is another way to block the semantic ladder available in the literature, and it is a pity Price doesn't engage it. Price accepts without question that reference, meaning, standing for, andtrue of are relations; what he denies is that they are theoretically useful relations. He grants that the semantic ladder exists, he just thinks it won't bear any weight. According to Wilfrid Sellars, these terms are only superficially relational. Sellars analyzes semantic terms as functional classifiers.[2] According to Sellars, the semantic ladder is mere appearance, not anything real at all; like a mirage, it not only bears no weight, but misleads us into a false view of the world. But in the Sellarsian picture there is much greater continuity between our ordinary metalinguistic speech and full-blooded linguistic theory, for ordinary metalinguistic speech is already engaged in functional classification. The full-blooded, anthropological, linguistic theory Price envisions would only be making explicit and articulate what is already happening (in disguise) in ordinary metalinguistic speech, according to Sellars.

Sellars is not as strongly anti-metaphysical as Price. (But see Robert Kraut's recent essay for an anti-metaphysical reading of Sellars.[3]) Sellars's naturalism has a bit more bite than Price's as well, for it is not clear that Price's naturalism doesn't end up losing the courage of its own convictions in his functional pluralism. Price says,

Science is only one of the games we play with language. Each game privileges its own ontology, no doubt, but the privilege is merely perspectival. Science is privileged "by its own lights," but to mistake this for an absolute ontological priority would be to mistake science for metaphysics, or first philosophy. (31)

Price's own subject naturalism prescribes a serious scientific attitude towards the investigation of the human's position in the physical and the social world; hasn't he undermined its claim on us by relegating it to one presumably optional perspective among many? Price responds,

If we equate science with the perspective-free standpoint, the view from nowhere, then science so conceived is certainly under threat. But why not see this simply as a challenge from within science to a particular philosophical conception of science? (31)

Isn't it incumbent on any position that calls itself 'naturalism' to claim that the scientific attitude and good scientific results have a claim on us, even if one has no particular interest in playing the science game?

In his introductory essay, Price distinguishes two approaches to the notion of representation: (1) an externalist approach that focuses on a representation's co-varying with or tracking some environmental condition; (2) an internalist approach that focuses on the cognitive (e.g., inferential) role of the representation in a cognitive architecture. This distinction is not made in the other essays in the book, though Price discussed it previously in his Tilburg Lectures. He thinks it takes some effort to see that the two notions of representation might come apart, but also that "it is an effort worth making," because "The vista that opens up is the possibility that representation in the internal sense is a much richer, more flexible, and more multipurpose tool than the naive view always assumes" (21). In the other essays "representation" is a bad word, fraught with philosophical baggage Price cannot wait to discard, but here Price begins to recover a respectable usage for the term, and this is surely necessary if, as he claims, he seeks to respect folk usages whenever possible. As a side note, in this section of the Introduction, Price comes close to reconstructing (unknowingly, I'm fairly sure) Sellars's distinction between the non-semantic relation of picturing and the semantic non-relation of reference. This is not the only echo of Sellars I see in Price (his treatment of causation would be another). I'd love to see a more direct confrontation.

Sellars did not succeed in providing a sufficiently detailed stereoscopic image of humanity that coherently unites the scientific and the manifest images; perhaps Price is on the way to formulating a better view. But the job is not yet finished, as far as I can see. Price's views are tantalizing and even inspiring to the pragmatically and naturalistically inclined, and I look forward eagerly to further developments in Price's pragmatism.[4]

[1] Huw Price, Facts and the Function of Truth, Oxford: Basil Blackwell, 1988.

[2] See, e.g., Sellars, "Meaning as Functional Classification," Synthese 27 (1974): 417-37.

[3] Robert Kraut, "Universals, Metaphysical Explanations, and Pragmatism," The Journal of Philosophy CVII, 11 (November 2010): 590-609.

[4] Thanks to Paul Redding and especially Drew Christie for helpful comments on the first draft of this review.