Naturalistic Hermeneutics

Placeholder book cover

C. Mantzavinos, Naturalistic Hermeneutics, Cambridge University Press, 2005, 198pp, $68.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521848121.

Reviewed by Paul A. Roth, University of California-Santa Cruz


What philosophically viable theoretical approaches exist with regard to providing a theory of meaning (for natural languages)? C. Mantzavinos proposes to sort approaches into two broad categories -- naturalistic and non-naturalistic -- and to examine what he takes to be methodological exemplars from each category -- the hypothetico-deductive method and hermeneutics, respectively. He argues that the hypothetico-deductive method offers a viable approach to a theory of meaning and that hermeneutic approaches do not. But how has Mantzavinos's favored methodology fared as a type of theory of meaning? What does philosophical history indicate about the method he favors? I return to these questions below.

Although relatively brief, this book has large ambitions. Divided into two parts of three chapters each (a total of just 156 pages of text), the first part surveys, only to repudiate, the accounts of hermeneutics found in Dilthey, Heidegger, and Gadamer. In the second part, Mantzavinos develops an exposition of a naturalistic account of meaning and text interpretation founded on the hypothetic-deductive method. Here he takes himself to be pursuing an account of meaning which Popper and Hempel failed to see through to completion. "The protagonists of the hypothetico-deductive method, Popper and Hempel, originally viewed it as a method that is directed toward deductive causal explanations in the sciences. This seems to me to be the decisive weakness of their analysis… . I regard it as the main thrust of my argument to extend the range of application of the hypothetico-deductive method to what I call the 'reconstructions of meaning.'" (xi-xii)

As this brief characterization suggests, Mantzavinos takes the notion of meaning to be explicable as part of the natural world and in roughly the (methodological) fashion in which the natural world comes to be theoretically comprehended. The methodological opposition between hermeneutics and natural science gives rise to two dualisms, both of which Mantzavinos looks to repudiate -- understanding v. explanation and (my terms, not his) idiographic v. nomothetic. Anti-naturalism, that is, enters into the debate because assessing meaning cannot be done causally (i.e., yield explanations), and it cannot be done by causal analysis because of the singularity of the events scrutinized (i.e., these events are historically specific and non-generalizable).

In this regard, the second of the two dualisms mentioned proves decisive in giving the debate its philosophical shape. For the alleged singularity of the socially real gives to the human sciences its distinctive, non-natural Fach, a reality constituted by the psyche of those studied, and not the physical world historical beings inhabit. The reality so plumbed constitutes, on this view, a reality not of a material world.1 (See, e.g., p. 7) But having taken the conceptual as the object of investigation, Mantzavinos finds, not too surprisingly, the method for accessing the objects of understanding to be woefully underspecified. The author concludes that hermeneutics of, e.g., Dilthey's sort, prove "unproductive" and a methodological "dead end" (20) because Dilthey provides no hint of how to connect mental facts with "other facts in this world." (20)

I leave it to others to decide on the relative merits of Mantzavinos's exposition of Heidegger. I focus instead on his exposition of the "hermeneutic circle," in large part because I have elsewhere argued that exactly this problem arises on any conception of language learning which rejects the analytic-synthetic distinction. In particular, the problem (which I take to be most compelling when one considers the infant language-learning case) arises when one asks how, in learning a language, one makes sense of the individual bits of linguistic expressions to which one is exposed when, ex hypothesi, words and sentences only have their meaning against a general background of linguistic and other knowledge.

Yet Mantzavinos dismisses Gadamer in particular and the hermeneutic circle generally for a number of reasons, one of them being that if Gadamer is correct, the whole notion of understanding and communication -- the very idea of a determinate meaning -- comes under a skeptical cloud from which there appears to be no escape. "Gadamer confronts us with the impossibility of understanding, indeed with the impossibility of any sort of communication." (58) But here (as elsewhere) fundamental philosophical points fail to surface in Mantzavinos's discussion. Skepticism about the notion of meaning has been rife: Wittgenstein on private language, Sellars on the Myth of the Given, Quine on indeterminacy of translation, Davidson on conceptual schemes, and Kripke on rule-following. A way to deal with such skepticism in short compass would be to show how criticisms directed at one school or approach -- e.g., the hermeneutic -- plausibly extend to silence skeptics or critics in the analytic tradition. Mantzavinos offers no such extension of his arguments, no such extension suggests itself given what he says, and, worst of all, he betrays no awareness that problems abound for any proposal linked to a naturalist theory of meaning.

In any case, the supposed methodological failure of hermeneutics resides in its insulating determinations of meaningfulness from empirical test. Hermeneutics so conceived traffics in methodological antinaturalism, "the position, namely, that presupposes that occurrences in the socio-historical reality cannot be viewed in continuity with occurrences in the natural world, and that they therefore require entirely different research methods from that drawn upon in the natural sciences." (81) This contrasts with methodological naturalism, "which maintains that all empirical sciences, including the natural sciences, the social sciences, and the humanities, can and must employ the same method, regardless of the differences in object area. In all areas in which increasing our knowledge about the real world can be presupposed as an aim, hypotheses can be formulated, consequences can be drawn by deduction, and these can be tested against empirical data." (81) Now, Mantzavinos sometimes glosses the naturalistic approach as requiring only that one "set up hypotheses whenever attempting to acquire knowledge and to test them critically using empirical observations." (82) However, and most characteristically in this work, he focuses on the hypothetico-deductive method as a scientific method par excellence. (See, e.g., 83, 86)

What does Mantzavinos take to be the meaning of 'meaning,' at least with respect to human action? One definition he gives goes as follows: "Human behavior is bestowed with meaning when the actor engaging in this behavior interprets it against the background of his goals, his beliefs, and his other mental states while interacting with his natural and social environments; this is a complex process and can involve the conscious or unconscious use of symbols -- though it need not." (87-8, italics in the original) The formulation suggests that Mantzavinos considers this statement, at least up to the semicolon, to state what is both necessary and sufficient for meaningful behavior. Mantzavinos speaks of "nexuses of meaning" (e.g., 88) which can in turn be accounted for by the hypothetico-deductive method. (88) The term 'nexus' -- of causes or of meanings -- receive no elucidation or explication. Nonetheless, his use of the term suggests an interconnection of parts logically determinate enough to allow for application of the hypothetico-deductive method. The method so applied, I take it, links attributions of psychological states or propositional attitudes of agents -- beliefs, desires, motives, and the like -- to observable (and so testable) aspects of the environment. Repeated actions allow for what is tantamount to causal explanation. For specific (singular) acts, the claim is that the hypothetico-deductive method reconstructs the "nexus of meaning … so that it is accurately depicted." (88)

Mantzavinos has much to say in his Chapter 5 with regard to how meaning cannot be apprehended. These remarks will be of less concern than discerning what one apprehends, on the view Mantzavinos promotes, when one apprehends "meaning." What, for example, constitutes the "truth-makers" when it comes to attributions of meaning? When ones depicts meaning accurately, just what has been depicted? Here Mantzavinos's remarks prove no help. For while he gestures to various types of brain scans and other empirical research (117ff.), he nowhere indicates how one moves from the evidence so obtained to a determination of semantic content. Of course, the fault is not his alone. I am not aware that this can be done.

But what then of "accuracy" with regard to meaning attribution? Here Mantzavinos makes the following suggestion: "In reconstructions [of nexuses of meaning], as in identifications of individual facts in general, certain singular descriptive statements serve as hypotheses precisely because one looks for reason for their truth or falsity." (118) The suggestion seems to be that one can treat individual statements as having their own individual empirical truth conditions. But now the aforementioned history which shadows the hypothetico-deductive method must be confronted. For surely, one would think, Mantzavinos cannot want to tie the application of his method to something like the verifiability criterion of meaning? Yet here, as throughout his work, Mantzavinos neither discusses nor acknowledges the problems which motivate the sort of holistic view of language which has set the problem agenda since the mid-1950s in this area.

But, even worse, no worked out account of the sort Mantzavinos proposes to defend -- an application of the hypothetico-deductive account to the analysis of meaning in the social sciences or the humanities -- receives any detailed working through of examples. There occurs only bald assertions of the following kind: "For us, however, what is of primary importance is that this particular type of understanding can be explained, and thus the hypothetico-deductive method can be applied to it without any difficulty." (123) That it can be applied at all, much less "without any difficulty" Mantzavinos never demonstrates.

Lest it be thought that these critical remarks slight the author's efforts, consider the following example which the author offers as a paradigm case of "meaning invariance."

Let us take the example of a one-year-old child, X, who, in the presence of her mother, points to a ball and says the word 'ball.' The meaning of this expression can be apprehended by identifying the intention of the expression -- in this case, that the child wants to communicate to her mother that the object in front of her is called that. The fundamental element in this nexus of meaning is the intention of giving the object a name. If one can show that this element arises in connection with other expressions from other children in similar situations, then one has discovered an invariance and thus has transformed the nexus of meaning into a causal nexus. (126-7)

Post Philosophical Investigations, one wonders just how such an unwitting evocation of the 'Fido'-Fido principle makes it into print. More amazing yet, Mantzavinos finds invariances of the sorts he requires everywhere -- in genetics, in cultures, in individuals. (127) Why, one wonders, has it taken so long to put the pieces together?

If the notion of meaning could be explicated just by reference to the truth conditions for individual statements, the skeptical and methodological challenges -- hermeneutic or otherwise -- would be quite different. The inability to explicate meaning in terms of individual statements, however, just is what makes the problem of meaning appear logically intractable for the hypothetico-deductive approach. Mantzavinos apparently never considered exactly why Hempel did not advocate the hypothetico-deductive approach as a theory of meaning. Hempel's characterization of the problems in "Problems and Changes in the Empiricist Criterion of Meaning" (first published in 1950) remains apposite concerning the relation of the hypothetico-deductive model and questions of meaning. As Hempel notes:

In effect, the criterion thus arrived at qualifies a sentence as cognitively meaningful if its non-logical constituents refer, directly or in certain specified indirect ways, to observables. But it does not make any pronouncement on what "the meaning" of a cognitively significant sentence is, and in particular it neither says nor implies that that meaning can be exhaustively characterized by what the totality of possible tests would reveal in terms of observable phenomena. Indeed, the content of a statement with empirical import cannot, in general, be exhaustively expressed by means of any class of observation sentences.

In other words, the cognitive meaning of a statement in an empiricist language is reflected in the totality of its logical relationships to all other statements in that language and not to the observation sentences alone. In this sense, the statements of empirical science have a surplus meaning over and above what can be expressed in terms of relevant observation sentences.2

Hempel did not fail to see through to completion the project of applying the hypothetico-deductive method to the analysis of meaning. Rather, he articulated what has turned out to be an iterated philosophical lesson, viz., the "meaning" of statements concerns their complex relation to other statements held true and the very complex relation of all these statements, taken collectively, to experience. And what holds for determining the observational consequences of sentences of a logically articulated scientific theory holds, a fortiori, for the testable consequences of statements in ordinary language.

Mantzavinos simply fails to properly characterize the issues that gave rise to characteristic contemporary puzzles regarding meaning. "If a difficulty arises in the language comprehension process … then cognitive resources for resolving the problem are activated… . Our language comprehension system keeps all the information available so that it is possible to have recourse to all of the information categories at any time. The 'talk of a hermeneutic circle' does nothing more than imprecisely depict the search process that is activated if the interpreter of a linguistic expression does not understand something immediately." (46-7) But in describing the solution this way, Mantzavinos only demonstrates that he missed the problem motivating talk of the circle in the first place. Speakers of a language just are those who have solved, in some sense, the problem of meaning. How language users turn the trick of acquisition remains to be explained.

The hypothetico-deductive model might be used once a linguistically expressible theory of the world is in hand. But a theory of meaning which presupposes the ability to formulate, e.g., testable statements, allows itself the use of exactly what it should explain. Mantzavinos solves no mysteries about the theory of meaning because he overlooks what makes the "hermeneutic circle" a problem for all philosophers to ponder.

1 Conceiving of the social as real and yet existing only conceptually marks a key position even for those who do not claim to be hermeneutically inspired, e.g., Peter Winch. For extended discussion of "meaning realism", see my "Mistakes," Synthese (September 2003) 136:389-408, "Why There is Nothing Rather than Something: Quine on Behaviorism, Meaning, and Indeterminacy," Philosophy, Psychology, and Psychologism: Critical and Historical Readings on the Psychological Turn in Philosophy, ed. D. Jacquette (Kluwer Academic 2003), 263-287, and "The Object of Understanding," Empathy and Agency, ed. K. Stueber & B. Kögler, (Westview, 2000), 243-269.

2 C.G. Hempel, "Problems and Changes in the Empiricist Criterion of Meaning," in Classics of Analytic Philosophy, ed. Robert R. Ammerman (Indianapolis, IN: Hackett, 1990), 226-7.