Naturalized Bioethics: Toward Responsible Knowing and Practice

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Hilde Lindemann, Marian Verkerk, and Margaret Urban Walker (eds.), Naturalized Bioethics: Toward Responsible Knowing and Practice, Cambridge University Press, 2008, 275pp., $27.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521719407.

Reviewed by Rosemarie Tong, University of North Carolina at Charlotte


In the introduction to Naturalized Bioethics: Toward Responsible Knowing and Practice, Margaret Urban Walker seeks to explicate "naturalism in ethics" (1). Although Walker never offers a final definition of naturalized ethics/naturalized bioethics, she does make it clear that "minimally, naturalism in ethics is committed to understanding moral judgment and moral agency in terms of natural facts about ourselves and our world" (1). In addition, she stresses that feminist naturalized ethics/bioethics views moral theory as "situated discourse" (4); that is, as the product of particular ethical conversations among particular people at particular times and places. Finally, Walker emphasizes that naturalized ethics/bioethics emerges in the trenches, so to speak. It is to be contrasted, I suppose, with "armchair" ethics/bioethics, practiced by experts primarily skilled at the "logical manipulation of general concepts" (7) and the use of "decontextualized arguments" (7).

Walker readily admits that the naturalized bioethics project she conceived together with Hilde Lindemann and Marian Verkerk is a critical response to principlism in bioethics. She claims that principlism, especially principlism as articulated by Tom Beauchamp and James Childress in Principles of Biomedical Ethics, is quite abstract and somewhat, though not totally, disinterested in empirical data. In addition, she implies that the kind of reflective equilibrium principlists practice, when they check "considered judgments" (12) against "independently plausible principles" (12), is fine so far as it goes, but that it is no competition for the very wide reflective equilibrium naturalists practice.

Substituting the phrase "relevant beliefs" for "considered judgments" (12), Walker claims that naturalists are committed to gathering and using scientific, personal, social, institutional, and political facts throughout the moral decision-making process. Naturalism does not simply bow in the direction of "context" as an item to be checked off a to-do list in a mechanical application of principles. Rather it luxuriates in context, mining it for empirical data -- especially data about power relationships -- that will result in better ethical decisions. Walker seems to think that principlism has run its course; that it is increasingly static. She comments, for example, that it is not clear that the four principles (autonomy, beneficence, non-maleficence, and justice) "are any longer in play in an ongoing process of reflective equilibrium; they seem to stay in place come what may" (11).

Walker tells us that good moral thinking should be characterized by "curiosity," "imagination," and "accountability" (7-8), but she does not specify (as most of the authors in the anthology do) whether it is enough for us to bounce our data against the traditional bioethical principles, or whether we should instead search for new bioethical principles (though they probably wouldn't be called that). At one point Walker implies that we should indeed consider thoroughly revamping bioethics as we have known it. She quotes James Lindemann Nelson favorably when he states that "the chief values of mainstream bioethics … remain relatively firmly fixed despite countervailing theoretical ferment in other areas of ethics and even in the light of what seem to be rather disturbing empirical findings" (12). Whether or not the project of naturalized bioethics is as ambitious as I have just suggested, it is certainly bioethics written "in a new key," one that presents the concept of responsibility as simultaneously epistemic and ethical. For this reason, Walker, Lindemann, and Verkerk divide Naturalized Bioethics into two parts: Responsible Knowing and Responsible Practice. They willingly admit, however, that any division between the epistemic and the ethical is likely to be "artificial" (13). Walker specifically comments: "For one thing, knowing takes place through practices, such as observation, interviewing, conversing, crediting, testimony, performing research experiments, appropriating the authoritative results of others, and so forth. For another, all practices rely on some shared beliefs" (13). Knowledge bleeds into practice and practice transforms knowledge in naturalized bioethics.

Several essays in this remarkably diverse anthology focus on people with disabilities. Jackie Leach Scully writes that hearing-impaired people do not necessarily view their disability as a calamity, as an unalloyed misfortune. On the contrary, hearing-impaired people who are part of Deaf Culture view their hearing impairment as an opportunity to develop special skills of human communication. They value their use of Sign and reliance on visual and tactile modes of human expression. Members of Deaf Culture also value their sense of community, the kind of thick community that is typically forged when a group of people is marginalized. For them to want to have a child like themselves -- a child with a hearing impairment -- is not, as they see it, necessarily a selfish desire on their part. Rather, it may simply be a legitimate desire to share their own good lives with their children. Yet, as important as it is to affirm the values of Deaf Culture, I do not think that the good features of Deaf Culture in and of themselves guarantee that the adults in it will always act unselfishly with only the good of their children in mind. Like adults who live outside of Deaf Culture, they may at times make selfish choices, indeed choices that may harm their children.

Also focusing on people with disabilities, in this instance people with severe cognitive disabilities, Eva Feder Kittay expresses anger at those philosophers who think their conception of the good life -- namely, a life in which contemplation is the "highest human endeavor" and logical inquiry "the crown jewel of the human mind" (p. 231) -- is the best conception of life for all humankind. As she sees it, such philosophers often view people with severe cognitive disabilities -- people like her daughter Sasha -- as non-persons. They are so driven to establish that human beings without the ability to reason are not persons, that they fail to appreciate the ways in which people with severe cognitive abilities are persons. Kittay thinks that true philosophers/bioethicists should be humble enough to recognize that their conception of human good is not everyone's conception of human good. Hubris is a sign of a poor philosopher/bioethicist, in her estimation. Kittay very rightly encourages us to commend being respectful of persons whose cognitive abilities are limited, but who are nonetheless full-fledged members of the human community. I only wish she had developed more extensively her views on human personhood and how they may relate, for example, to discussions about the moral status of viable fetuses or patients in persistent vegetative states.

Other essays in the anthology seek to reinterpret the principle of autonomy. Hilde Lindemann probes the role of a healthcare proxy who knows that the man she calls Tosca-Edmund, the man who loves caring for his pet cat and listening to opera, would never want a course of treatment that might result in his living the last months of his life totally bedridden and quasi-unconscious. The healthcare proxy also realizes that, as the physicians see it, the temporarily unconscious man they call Patient-Edmund can make a recovery of sorts. They want to restore Patient-Edmund to full consciousness so that he has a chance to change his mind about his "no-futile-care" advance directive. The healthcare proxy resists this mode of proceeding. As she sees it, Tosca-Edmund meant his advance directive to apply in situations just like the one in which he finds himself. He does not want the opportunity to be awakened so that he can choose against his own best interests when faced with the immediate fear of dying. But can we be certain, I wonder, that Tosca-Edmund is the "authentic" Edmund the healthcare proxy seeks to protect? Is it not possible that Patient-Edmund is, after all, the "authentic" Edmund?

Interestingly, in another important essay in the volume, Agnieszka Jaworska provides a nuanced interpretation of autonomy according to which we can act autonomously even when we know our decision flies in the face of what we have always said is best for us and most in accord with our own self-identity. Jaworska provides the example of a patient, Lazaroff, who is dying of cancer. Lazaroff has always maintained that he does not want to die in a totally bedridden, semi-conscious state. But, as his time to die nears, Lazaroff begins to insist on a course of aggressive treatment that will probably condemn him to this sort of debilitated state. The physician thinks Lazaroff should be prevented from doing something that does not mesh with his best interests; that is, his interests as he has consistently maintained them throughout his life. What the physician does not understand, however, is that Lazaroff has decided that even though it does not make sense in terms of what he has always told himself as well as others about the manner and fashion in which he wants to die, he has decided all previous bets are off. He now wants to try everything and anything in order to keep on living, even if doing so makes no rational sense to anyone including himself. There is something fundamentally liberating about Jaworska's interpretation of autonomy. In her worldview, we do not necessarily need to be true to ourselves to act autonomously. We have it within our power to escape even the box of our own self-identity if we feel a pressing need to do so.

Raymond G. De Vries, Lisa Kane Low, and Elizabeth (Libby) Bogdan-Lovis are also interested in the nuances of autonomy. They stress how difficult it is for individuals to distinguish between their authentic wants and their socially-constructed wants. Specifically, they trace how the desire for "non-medically indicated surgical birth" (48) began to increase among pregnant women in the United States. (In 2005 over 30 percent of U.S. births were performed via Caesarian section.) What factors caused so many U.S. women to agree to a C-section, indeed demand one in some instances? The authors think that fear may explain some of the uptick. Armed with information from Internet sources, many pregnant women worry that vaginal delivery is more risky than surgical delivery. Or they worry that incontinence will be their fate if they fail to submit to the knife. Similarly, obstetricians fear that a delivery may go "sour" if they are not in total control of it. In addition to fear, greed may account for the number of C-sections in the United States. Caesarian sections cost more than vaginal deliveries, and so enrich obstetricians and/or the institutions for which they work. Unless a woman is aware of how such factors may be shaping her decision to have a C-section, she cannot give bona fide consent to the surgery -- a cutting into her body -- that may not benefit either herself or her child. The strength of this article is that it helps patients realize that not only their own desires, but also their healthcare professionals' desires, may be constructed by social forces. Patients need to ask themselves why they want a certain procedure or medication. The why question is, in my estimation, patients' best defense against making major medical mistakes.

Reiterating some of Walker's introductory points, Naomi Scheman writes that autonomy has epistemic as well as moral value. She claims that clinicians and researchers should respect not only patients'/research subjects' "bounds of selfhood" (this is my body, not yours), but also patients'/research subjects' unique knowledge about their own bodies and psyches. Clinicians and researchers need to regard patients/research subjects as active participants in their own course of treatment. Sometimes patients really do know what is the best course of medical treatment for themselves. They know their bodies in a way no test or machine can know them.

Adding specific details to Scheman's general point is Tod Chambers. He stresses the important role narration plays in human lives. Indeed, he claims that unless a person has a self-narration that person will lack both "cohesion over time" and a sense of accountability for his/her actions. As Chambers sees it, narratives are tools for ethicists and medical ethicists. For the ethicist, autobiography is the tool for responding to the question "What is the good, what narrative am I a part of, and how should I live my life?" Similarly, for the medical ethicist, biography is the tool for responding to the question "What is this person's story?" (129). Only if a person has a story to tell about himself/herself is he/she in the position of being autonomous/viewed as autonomous, according to Chambers. But, as much as I affirm Chambers' analysis, what "good" is a patient's story if there is no healthcare practitioner who has the time or desire to listen to it?

One of the strongest features of Naturalized Bioethics is its way of unfolding unexplored concepts like hope and coping on the one hand and reinterpreting relatively overexplored concepts like informed consent on the other. Mare Knibbe and Marian Verkerk identify the role of hope in a specific context; namely that of a pediatric liver transplant center. In this context, parents are typically hoping that some treatment or some organ donor will restore their dying infant to health. According to Knibbe and Verkerk, the hope experienced by the parents has four features: (1) the futurity of the hope object, (2) the desirability of the hope object, (3) the "nonzero" possibility of achieving the hope object, and (4) the efficacy of the hope object -- that is, its capacity “to steer thought, feelings, attention, speech and acts" (168-169). Interestingly, these two bioethicists stress that no matter how realistically healthcare professionals explain a medical situation to someone, that person's hopes may rise too high or sink too low. Hope, like fear, is a very visceral phenomenon that no healthcare professional, however responsible, can entirely control.

Jodi Halpern and Margaret Oliva Little explore the phenomenon of coping in the medical context. They show how patients use coping mechanisms to weather assaults on their egos and survive life crises. According to Halpern and Little, "there has been a frustrating gap between raising patients' awareness of the health risks certain behaviors carry and conveying such risk in a way that actually motivates a change of behavior" (143). They believe that if clinicians want to be more effective motivators, they need to understand that "at the core of human motivation … is the normative activity of coping -- of maintaining a sense of self and world as meaningful, stable and secure" (144). Scare tactics and shame tactics threaten patients' sense of self. Better to encourage obese individuals to participate in programs like Boston's "Healthy at Every Size" (154) than to berate them for their fatness. It is hard to motivate patients to lose weight if they feel that people do not love and accept them as they are.

Joan C. Tronto offers an account of informed consent that aims to widen its scope to include the principle of justice as well as the principles of autonomy and beneficence. As she sees it, there are two ways to think of consent: (1) consent-as-autonomy and (2) consent-as-a-grant-of-authority (191). If we see consent as autonomy, then we will immediately focus on the patient's rights to ample information and the healthcare professional's duties to provide it. In contrast, if we see consent as a grant-of-authority, then informed consent can be understood as a long-term trust relationship throughout which the healthcare professional acts on behalf of the patient. The healthcare professional becomes committed to providing more than mere information to the patient. He/she becomes committed to making sure that the patient can make good judgments about the information provided. Insofar as informed consent is widened in this way, the healthcare professional must "genuinely consider … whether systemic forms of discrimination, substandard treatment, exclusion, and so on color too profoundly the patient's capacity to make a judgment" (195). Tronto is certainly on the right track here. It is one thing for a well-educated and privileged person to enroll in a Phase One drug study and quite another for a person with pennies to follow suit. People's vulnerabilities limit their autonomy.

In another essay, Annelies van Heijst traces the essential link between naturalized bioethics and an ethics of care. Van Heijst describes two old paradigms of medicine. The first paradigm, which lasted until the middle of the nineteenth century, was a religious paradigm: mend the body in order to save the soul. It was supplanted by a second paradigm, which still obtains today: restore health and prolong life. Van Heijst believes it is time for a new, third paradigm of medicine; namely, one that views the goal of medicine as "professional relief of suffering in accordance with the patient's own good" (200). Her reasons for pushing this paradigm, which she calls professional loving care (PLC), are fourfold: (1) advances in medicine's powers have increased its capacity to prolong the length of life even when that life is one of utter despair; (2) people do not share the same conception of the good, or how valuable health and life at any cost are to them; (3) healthcare professionals feel obligated to try "everything," when they should instead do very little in the form of aggressive treatment; and (4) healthcare professionals are far too focused on patients' medical needs, so much so that they are increasingly blind to patients' human needs. My main problem with Van Heijst's paradigm is that it does not strike me as all that new. Her ideal type of medicine is already practiced and very well in many hospice and palliative care environments. Still, in fairness to Van Heijst, there is room for more in the way of professional loving care in many large hospital environments, where patients get to share few, if any, of their most personal fears and hopes with healthcare professionals.

In the book's final essay, Marian Verkerk and Hilde Lindemann give marching orders to bioethicists who want to be "naturalized." As Verkerk and Lindemann see it, naturalized bioethicists must work to make changes in the process of moral deliberation, their working conditions, and their role in the clinical setting. With respect to the process of moral deliberation, philosophers should use "bottom-up methods" (239) that rely on case comparisons, continual checks between theory and practice, and awareness of power hierarchies. To help healthcare professionals engage in serious moral reflection, bioethicists need to show them how (1) to confront the fact of human vulnerability; (2) to reflect together on people's core values and beliefs, people's actions, and the ways in which social norms shape people's values, beliefs, and actions; and (3) to map their own moral responsibilities so they can mesh their moral identities together in ways that permit them to serve their patients' good.

As much as I like many of the features of naturalized bioethics, I must confess that I do not think that it is always fair to principlists. The proponents of naturalized bioethics present it as de novo and somehow in opposition to principles. But this is not exactly the case. Here I think of recent editions of Tom Beauchamp and James Childress's Principles of Bioethics. They insist that principles are not everything in ethics and that context needs to be specified. They even get downright emotional. Beauchamp and Childress comment that

Principles and rules cannot fully encompass what occurs when parents lovingly play with and nurture their children, or when physicians and nurses provide palliative care for a dying patient and comfort to the patient's distressed spouse. Our feelings and concern for others lead us to actions that cannot be reduced to the following of rules and principles" (Beauchamp and Childress, Principles of Biomedical Ethics, p. 501).

But be this as it may -- it is a long and ongoing debate -- Naturalized Bioethics is an excellent anthology, well-worth reading. Many of the issues it raises are in fact new and it deepens our understanding of concepts such as autonomy and responsibility. Also welcome is the book's persistent focus on power issues. In this connection, I found the concluding chapter particularly good. In it, Verkerk and Lindemann plead with bioethicists to rethink their own professional identity. Bioethicists are not ethics experts in the sense of being more morally right or morally good than other people. Rather they are simply "scholars who make and maintain moral spaces in healthcare settings" (246) in which healthcare professionals, patients, families and friends can make good -- even if not the best -- moral decisions. Bioethicists are the enablers of moral conversation. It may begin with them, but it should not end with them -- at least not in the real/natural world in which we actually live.


Tom L. Beauchamp and James F. Childress, Principles of Biomedical Ethics, 4th ed. (New York: Oxford University Press, 1994).