Naturalizing Heidegger: His Confrontation with Nietzsche, His Contributions to Environmental Philosophy

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David E. Storey, Naturalizing Heidegger: His Confrontation with Nietzsche, His Contributions to Environmental Philosophy, SUNY Press, 2015, 276pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781438454832.

Reviewed by Chad Engelland, University of Dallas


In this book, David E. Storey puts his finger on one of the enduring paradoxes of Heidegger: on the one hand, he decidedly undermines the Cartesian philosophy of nature and the technological domination it engenders; on the other hand, his alternative posture of openness remains dogged by a puzzling oversight. Just what is it that we are being counseled to be open towards? Storey argues that the posture of openness is not enough; for most of the book he maintains it is nothing, in fact. However, he does think the Heidegger of the early 1920s knew what we should be open to: the intrinsic intelligibility of nature and life.

The principal hero of Storey's tale is Heidegger the Aristotelian, but this hero tragically falls prey to the seduction of Kantianism. "My point is that during the 1920s, Heidegger shifts from a Neo-Aristotelian realism to a kind of Kantian skepticism about whether certain biological categories are constitutive principles of nature, rather than just structures of human understanding" (30). Storey imagines what could have happened had Heidegger resisted the Kantian framework:

In other words, what if Heidegger abandoned the ontic priority of the question of being and universalized the ontological structure of being-in-the-world? What if all beings, all the way down from apes to amoebas to atoms, were shot through with some kind of interiority or transcendence? . . . If something like this were possible, then there would be a transition from fundamental ontology to cosmology, primordial nature would no longer be conceived of as pure otherness, and there would no longer be the ontological dichotomy of human existentiality and natural categoriality. (77)

The "naturalized Heidegger" this book calls for is one stripped of the transcendentalism of Being and Time and the poeticism of the Contributions and clothed in the mantle of science and the philosophy of nature. It is one that fits into the following list of thinkers: Aristotle, Friedrich Nietzsche, Max Scheler, Alfred North Whitehead, Hans Jonas, and Evan Thompson.

Storey wants to affirm both a deep continuity between humans and other animals and a hierarchically structured scale of nature and values. He thinks he can combine these two theses by following Nietzsche and underscoring the "bottom-up" origin of the differentiation (215). This twin foundation can then afford the possibility of a robust environmental ethic.

I found myself agreeing with the central aim of the book -- the contemporary renewal of the philosophy of nature through an integration of science and phenomenology -- while disagreeing with some of the interpretive claims regarding Heidegger and Nietzsche. Instead of putting them in opposition, I think they can be regarded as complementary, and I think the urgent task of squaring Heidegger and science need not involve excising his transcendentalism or compromising the human difference. Before fleshing out these reservations, I will provide an overview of the chapters.

In the first, Storey reviews three waves of interpretation regarding Heidegger and life: Hans Jonas and Karl Löwith, who charge Heidegger with acosmic existentialism, deep ecologists, who prize the musings of the later Heidegger, and the eco-phenomenologists, who integrate phenomenology and science. Storey aligns himself with the reading of Jonas, Löwith, and eco-phenomenology against deep ecologists.

In the following four chapters, he works his way through the Heideggerian corpus. The second chapter turns to Heidegger's engagement with nature both in the mid-1920s lecture courses on Aristotle and the late 1920's lecture course on philosophical biology. Storey points out that Heidegger had planned to write a book on Aristotle that would have involved discussing the being of life in general and not just the being of human life. Lecture courses from the mid 1920's put some meat on these bones. Storey ferrets out a passage from 1924 in which Heidegger attributes some sense of world to a jellyfish! The important point, for Storey, is that the lecture courses affirm "some sort of ontological continuity between human and nonhuman life" (45).

The next three chapters document the demise of this promising Aristotelian beginning. The third chapter offers a critical reading of Being and Time aimed to show that the text partially betrays the earlier naturalism and paves the way for the later anti-naturalism. Nature is classified ambiguously as the object of scientific investigation and as the subject of poetry; while the earlier writings prize the former, the later writings prize the latter. Storey is particularly troubled that Heidegger regards world as a specifically human phenomenon and that nature must be understood in reference to this human phenomenon. The fourth chapter finds this ambiguity persisting into the winter semester 1929-1930 lecture course, Fundamental Concepts of Metaphysics. On the one hand, Heidegger engages contemporary science and has something of an illuminating hierarchy of nature, animals, and humans; on the other, he fails to embrace evolution and emphasize the kinship of the human and the animal. The fifth chapter attempts to show that the later Heidegger's resources for environmental ethics are too "vague" and "anthropocentric" to be of much use. The charge of anthropocentricism comes from the insistence on a difference in kind between humans and animals and from the fact that the poetic approach to nature is "still human" (139).

Alongside this chronological review of Heidegger's corpus, the text also develops a reading of nihilism which peaks in the sixth chapter. Storey joins the project of demythologizing Heidegger's history of being. Then, he argues that Nietzsche's will-to-power cannot be equated with human projection but is instead an expression of a universal conception of nature on par with the early Heidegger's reading of Aristotle.

The seventh chapter constitutes the heart of the book. Storey argues that Nietzsche's naturalism is just the sort of thing that solves the problem of nihilism because it navigates between the twin dangers of a "dualistic, transcendent metaphysics" and "a reductive, scientific naturalism" (176). It does this by grounding value in the universal biological act of valuing while nonetheless recognizing a kind of hierarchy of life. The final chapter clarifies the emergent "nonreductive naturalism" suggested by the early Heidegger and developed earlier by Nietzsche. Storey terms this a "hierarchical biocentrism," which includes universal ecological value and increasing levels of intrinsic value.

Storey argues that only intrinsic value can be the basis of an ethical theory; Heidegger the transcendental thinker pays attention to our posture rather than intrinsic value; therefore he cannot provide the basis of an ethical theory. But this frames the matter as a false either-or. What is Heidegger's question? It is not: What is intrinsically valuable? It is instead: What's the matter with us that we are closed to what's there? Mind bogglingly, intrinsic values can deliberately be ignored; they can fail to move us. It is therefore not enough to iterate intrinsic values; it is also necessary to give an account of (and indeed to try and induce) the kind of disposition one must have in order to be receptive to them. In the final chapter, Storey does acknowledge the value of the later Heidegger in this regard:

It is not as though Gelassenheit and a poetic posture toward nature and ecological consciousness and so on are not important -- they are. But I see Gelassenheit as something like a necessary but insufficient condition for a robust environmental ethic. The sublime can stop us in our tracks -- and suspend scientific naturalism -- but it cannot help us move forward (222).

Heidegger's transcendentalism, it turns out, is necessary for Storey's project after all. Thus, rather than the either Heidegger or Nietzsche of the first seven chapters, the considered view is both Heidegger and Nietzsche.

Storey says that for Nietzsche the higher perspective will somehow be more humane: "So this value scheme is a hierarchy in which the higher, more developed, more evolved, more powerful viewpoint is less dominating, less oppressive, less anthropocentric" (215). This description does not match Nietzsche's own account of the philosopher to come who will incarnate the will to power. The philosopher, Nietzsche writes, "does not deny 'existence,' he rather affirms his existence and only his existence, and this perhaps to the point at which he is not far from harboring the impious wish: pereat mundus, fiat philosophia, fiat philosophus, fiam!"[1] Heidegger, by contrast, wants to recover something of Aristotle's conviction that humans are not the best thing there is, and he does so by turning to the sense of the overwhelming in nature. I grant that Heidegger does not say enough, but what Nietzsche does say is more troubling for an environmental ethic than Storey lets on.

Storey follows Nietzsche in rooting values in the act of valuing, which is universal to living beings. He is not unaware of the theoretical problems with his account, such as justifying the move from "mosquitoes actively value" to "mosquitoes are valuable" and the question of a criterion for adjudicating conflicts between the valuations of mosquitoes and humans (233). His aim is not to settle such issues. Rather he wishes to gesture in the direction of a renewed philosophy of nature with implications for environmental ethics. However, several problems he brushes aside do call for more discussion.

First, there is the choice of naturalism over transcendentalism. Storey briefly considers Heidegger's reason for rejecting naturalism:

to him, it does not matter whether you restrict reality to what can be accessed by physics or biology or psychology -- you are still defining reality according to the category of actuality from the standpoint of a theoretical attitude that overlooks its prior, pretheoretical involvement in a meaningful world (25).

He distinguishes Husserl's logical refutation of psychologism from Heidegger's "ontological-historical" refutation (157). How can the naturalism propounded by this book avoid either the logical or the ontological-historical refutation? Moreover, what is problematical about the transcendental approach? As far as I can tell, the answer given is that it succumbs to a Cartesian dualism of humans and nature (28, 31) and a Kantian idea that intelligibility is a function of the human understanding (30). I will address the charge of dualism below; let me just note in passing that this textbook interpretation of Kant is not Heidegger's own. Heidegger remains an ontic realist even if he regards being and truth as dependent on human beings.[2] Moreover, Kant is not alone in highlighting the importance of human understanding; Aristotle begins his first philosophy with reference to the human inquirer (qua thinker not qua animal) and he emphasizes, like Heidegger, the role of understanding in providing a place for the forms. The shift from Heidegger's Aristotle to Heidegger's Kant isn't a dramatic one.

Second, there is the curious rejection of human difference. If the project requires stratification, why dismiss Heidegger's identification of a difference in kind between humans and animals? Heidegger emphasizes the difference because he wants to avoid the dualism in human nature the book implicitly advocates. According to this book, Aristotle rightly "regarded the human being as life 'plus' something else, that is, nous and logos" (63). But this dualism is a misreading. In the De Anima, Aristotle regards understanding and speech as higher modes of life, not as something layered on top of life. Heidegger follows Aristotle in believing that the higher transforms the meaning of the lower, and this means that our openness to truth transforms the meaning of our animal inheritance. The difference in kind between humans and other animals is compatible with evolution and contemporary findings in science, and it is intrinsically bound up with the compelling refutation of scientific naturalism.[3]

Third, there is the underplaying of Heidegger's methodological worry. "In FCM [Fundamental Concepts of Metaphysics], Heidegger became bogged down in questions of methodological access to nonhumans rather than accept the evidence of our own experience as a clue to the subjective and evaluative aspects of living things" (223-224). But how should this "clue" be construed? Storey chastises Heidegger for being anthropocentric, but he wants the analytic of Dasein to be projected in various degrees on all levels of nature. How can one guide such a projection to keep it from being mere anthropomorphizing? That was something that gave Heidegger pause, and as far as I can tell this book does not show a way forward.

What is the solution? As long as phenomenology deals with experience from the inside there is no way to transfer it from the human to the non-human world. Some sense of experiencing experience from the outside is necessary. The way to rehabilitate this possibility is to reintroduce animate form and movement, which makes manifest outwardly what is inwardly experienced. In my view, it is this methodological failing that renders the later Heidegger inadequate for a philosophy of nature. For in 1922, Heidegger proposes to approach human life in terms of life in general and this in terms of "the domain of the being of life as a particular kind of movement" (i.e., on the basis of an interpretation of De motu animalium). What is shown here is how "'intentionality' comes into view for Aristotle and indeed as 'objective,' i.e., as a how of the movement of life that is somehow 'noetically' illuminated when it goes about its dealings."[4] The second sentence is decisive: a view of the act of intentionality from the outside thanks to animate movement. What is anti-natural about Heidegger is not his transcendentalism or the focus on disclosive moods and poetic openness. What is anti-natural is the relegation of animate form to superficiality, the move that Bacon and Descartes made at the beginning of modernity, the move that leaves natural beings, from aardvarks to zebras, bereft of characteristic ways of acting and being and renders their experience closed to human experience. Animate form and movement enable us to access the lived lives of other animals in a way that modern methodology, whether of the scientific or traditional phenomenological sort, does not allow. Aristotelian animate movement rather than Nietzschean drives can solve Heidegger's legitimate methodological worry.[5]

Despite these interpretive and theoretical issues, Naturalizing Heidegger is a salutary warning to those who would valorize the later Heidegger and regard the posture of openness as sufficient for establishing an environmental ethic. The highly readable book shows us that our urgent task is to recover a sense of the cosmos, an experience of natural beings charged with intrinsic intelligibility, goodness, and indeed beauty.

[1] On the Genealogy of Morals, in Basic Writings of Nietzsche, ed. and trans. Walter Kaufmann (New York: The Modern Library, 1992), III.7.

[2] See Taylor Carman, Heidegger's Analytic: Interpretation, Discourse, and Authenticity in 'Being and Time' (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2003), 155-203; Chad Engelland, "The Phenomenological Kant: Heidegger's Interest in Transcendental Philosophy," Journal of the British Society for Phenomenology 41 (2010): 150-169.

[3] Chad Engelland, "Heidegger and the Human Difference," Journal of the American Philosophical Association 1 (2015): 175-193.

[4] "Phenomenological Interpretations in Connection with Aristotle: An Indication of the Hermeneutical Situation (1922)," trans. John van Buren, in Supplements: From the Earliest Essays to 'Being and Time' and Beyond, ed. van Buren (Albany: SUNY, 2002), 143-144, quoted in part by Storey (39).

[5] See, for example, Maxine Sheets-Johnstone, "Animation: The Fundamental, Essential, and Properly Descriptive Concept," Continental Philosophy Review 42 (2009): 375-400. My own attempt to "naturalize" phenomenology follows a similar path. Chad Engelland, Ostension: Word Learning and the Embodied Mind (Cambridge, MA: MIT, 2014), chp. 10.