Naturalizing Intention in Action

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Franck Grammont, Dorothée Legrand, and Pierre Livet (eds.), Naturalizing Intention in Action, MIT Press 2010, 352pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780262013673.

Reviewed by Neil Levy, Florey Neuroscience Institutes and Oxford Centre for Neuroscience



Phenomenology from Husserl to Merleau-Ponty had as one of its principal themes the claim that mental states should not be understood as simply states internal to agents, but instead as ways of unveiling the world. This collection of papers is largely devoted to the claim that contemporary cognitive science offers support for this view. The volume is structured to build a cumulative case for the claim. The earlier papers present overviews of important work in cognitive psychology and cognitive neuroscience on intentional action, including helpful papers by significant researchers in these areas, while the later papers make the case for the claim, often with explicit reference to phenomenology (though only one paper gets involved in the complexities of phenomenology; to that extent, the volume remains analytic- philosopher friendly). The experimental results reported are rich and the volume is useful for this fact alone (though much of it will be familiar to empirically oriented philosophers of mind). The case built on its basis, for the claim that intention is deeply structured by our involvement in the world, is always interesting and, when it is advanced in a weak form, it is very plausible. When, as in the latter papers of the volume, something more ambitious is attempted, however, the claims are much less convincing.

The first half of the volume is concerned largely with what cognitive states an agent must possess in order to act intentionally, as well as in order to identify an action as intentional. The central data these papers build on stems from the work of Giacomo Rizzolatti and Vittorio Gallese on what they call canonical neurons and mirror neurons. Gallese himself contributes a useful outline of this work, though (perhaps because he offers an interpretation of these results which is philosophically rich) the paper is held back until the second half of the volume. As a result, anyone who reads the book from cover to cover will be familiar with the findings before they hear from one of its original sources. Roughly, canonical neurons respond to the affordance — the potentials for action — of objects, while mirror neurons respond when either the agent acts or observes the actions of others. Rizzolatti and Gallese identified these neurons on the basis of single cell recordings from the brains of macaques. There has been some scepticism regarding their existence in human beings, but these papers present convergent evidence that analogous processes occur in the human brain. Especially interesting is J. A. Sommerville and A. L. Woodward’s work on infants, which they report themselves. They found that infants’ ability to understand behavior as intentional developed more quickly if they had greater experience of handling and grasping toys (the infants were given velcro-covered mittens, enabling them to grasp toys more easily). On the basis of this and related evidence, contributors begin to build the case for the claim that being able to understand an action as intentional depends upon being able to perform an action of that type.

The case is sensitively developed by Colin Allen. Allen is able to straddle the empirical and the philosophical with ease; unsurprisingly since he is a philosopher of biology (specifically ethology). Allen argues that there are good reasons to accept each of the following three propositions:

1. Understanding intentional (purposeful) actions requires understanding the intentional (contentful) attitudes that motivate them;

2. Monkeys do not understand the intentional (contentful) states that motivate actions;

3. Monkeys understand the intentional (purposeful) actions of other monkeys.

Obviously, these three propositions cannot all be true at once. Allen’s paper is an exploration of the relative costs and benefits of rejecting each.

The existence of mirror neurons is a significant part of the evidence for proposition (3). Mirror neurons are apparently sensitive to the goal directedness of action, activating only when the action seems to be goal directed and not when similar movements do not seem to be aimed at anything. This fact has motivated some to think that mirror neurons play a role in theory of mind; they enable the animal to understand the intentions of conspecifics. But there is evidence that the macaques in which mirror neurons were first detected do not have theory of mind; they have repeatedly failed the false belief and mirror recognition tests commonly used for detecting theory of mind. One possibility, Allen suggests, is that though mirror neurons are precursors to theory of mind, in macaques they subserve two independent functions (much as, in his analogy, the male uretha subserves two independent functions, one reproductive and one eliminative). The fact that these independent functions were subserved by a single channel made their cooption to a unified function possible, but it took further developments for this to take place.

But another possibility is that macaques fail theory of mind tests because these tests are so different from the kinds of challenges they face in the wild state, not because they lack theory of mind. Evidence from experiments in which the animals compete for food — a kind of challenge they routinely face in the wild — provide some (though equivocal) support for the claim that they can understand the intentional states of conspecifics (and humans). But another possibility, the one that Allen thinks is philosophically most interesting, is that proposition (1) is false, and we do not need to understand intentional states in order to understand intentional actions. Instead, knowledge about other animals might be represented in some kind of format intrinsically linked to action, rather than in propositional form. On this view, an intention is partially constituted by motor representations, and understanding intentional action would involve the activation of a corresponding motor plan that is offline, or below the threshold for action. Allen suggests that macaques may understand their own actions in precisely the same way as they understand the actions of others, utilizing this lower level machinery. It is plain that Allen does not mean to displace personal level theory of mind by motor representations, but it is unclear how exactly he sees the two relating to one another. Perhaps theory of mind tests test for a high-level component of the relevant ability, but are insensitive to these lower-level components which, nevertheless, license the attribution of some kind of understanding of the relevant states to the animal. Human beings may be among the animals who understand intentional actions by means of motor representations, though we are also capable of higher-level conceptualizations of the motivating reasons for such actions.

Allen’s (admittedly somewhat speculative) suggestion opens up a host of interesting questions with regard to how we ought to understand our actions. A great deal depends, for the purposes of these questions, on what kinds of contents motor representations may have. How close do they come to the intentions we ascribe, at a personal level, to agents? Would it be misleading to attempt to express their contents in the form of propositional attitudes? In one of her three contributions to this volume, Dorethée Legrand seems to suggest that bodily intentions organize and drive all behaviour, but the evidence seems consistent with the much weaker claim that action is typically driven by distal (agent-level) goals which are consciously accessible, even while the motor representation that is the proximate cause of behaviour might lack all personal level content. Might motor representations nevertheless sometimes be sufficient to trigger actions by themselves — that is, might there be actions, in normal agents, without distal goal representations at all? These are questions which are left unexplored, and which perhaps remain empirically intractable, at least for the moment.

Allen’s speculation sets the scene for the themes explored in much of the rest of the book; again the question whether the ability to represent a movement as an intentional action is dependent on the ability to perform an act of that type is central. In his contribution, Franck Grammont discusses experiments spurred by the discovery that macaques, whose mirror neurons fire when they see a person grasping food, show no such activation when the food was grasped by someone using a pair of pliers. Grammont and his collaborators hypothesized that the failure of activation was due to the fact that macaques do not normally use tools, and that the action was therefore not in their behavioral repertoire. They tested this hypothesis by laboriously training the monkeys to use the pliers; subsequently, they did show mirror neuron activation when observing the tools being used. This finding, as Grammont notes, dovetails nicely with Sommerville and Woodward’s work. Grammont argues that findings by other researchers demonstrate something similar; subjects shown videos of actors performing biomechanically impossible actions (the videos had been altered so that the actors’ arms appeared to pass through their knees) failed to show activation in premotor and parietal areas. But his bald claim that having an action within one’s repertoire is necessary for understanding the intention of the agent, is clearly false: we have no trouble understanding biomechanically impossible actions as intentional (else Hollywood movies would be even more confusing than they are).

The close connection between the ability to represent an action as intentional and the ability to perform that action constitutes, according to many of the contributors, evidence in favour of a simulationist account of mind reading. It suggests, that is, that we attribute intentions to others using our motor representations as a template. As Gallese puts it in his contribution to this volume, it suggests an intrinsically embodied simulation, and not a theory, underlies folk psychology. Legrand and Marco Iacoboni explicitly connect this claim to the phenomenological tradition, arguing that the scientific evidence supports two claims which have been central to phenomenology since Husserl: that the world is experienced not as the object of disinterested cognition but as a space of potential action, and that it is given as an essentially shared world, a space of intersubjectivity.

These claims are plausible and the externalist conception of agency and mind sketched in these papers is powerful. Less successful, to my mind, are the attempts to use the scientific evidence to vindicate phenomenology as it was presented by Husserl, or to argue for a radically externalist and embodied view of mind. This last claim is developed most forcefully by Jean-Michel Roy and Dorethée Legrand, though it is already implicit in Pierre Livet and Jean-Luc Petit’s overview of contemporary philosophy of action which is the first substantive chapter in the volume. These authors claim that there is a constitutive link between intention and intentionality (in Brentano’s sense of the latter); that is, we can have contentful mental states at all only because we are capable of acting intentionally, and that therefore the intentionality of our mental states is partially constituted by our embodied grappling with the world. These are claims to which I am sympathetic, but the claim that the cognitive science cited here demonstrates them strikes me as strained. The experimental evidence concerns only some proportion of our intentional states. Moreover, the evidence from human beings seems only to bear on our acquisition of the ability to understand actions as intentional, not on the further question whether for each additional action type, we can only understand that action type as intentional if we have it in our repertoire. Infants might acquire the ability to understand actions as intentional on the basis of motor representations, as most of the contributors to this volume suggest, but once they have acquired this ability they may be able to generalize it to behaviours they cannot perform (perhaps using the other cues to intention, such as revisability, contingent and self-propelled movement, or perhaps simply by adopting a default assumption that animals act intentionally). Perhaps motor representation is necessary for the development of belief/desire representations of actions as intentional; once the latter framework is in place, we can dispense with the former in understanding actions.

The mixture of phenomenology, neuroscience, cognitive psychology and philosophy of mind and action is a heady brew. For the most, the papers collected here vindicate the claim that it is a mix that can be fruitful. If I have a criticism of the volume as a whole, it centres on what it lacks. The more ambitious papers present pictures of human agency, rather than detailed arguments; there is no attempt to rebut objections or to fill in the details. The picture is an attractive one, that deserves further exploration, but it remains to be seen whether it can stand up to criticism in a form that is not so heavily qualified as to be unrecognizable.