Naturalizing Logico-Mathematical Knowledge: Approaches from Philosophy, Psychology and Cognitive Science

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Sorin Bangu (ed.), Naturalizing Logico-Mathematical Knowledge: Approaches from Philosophy, Psychology and Cognitive Science, Routledge, 2018, 305 pp., $140.00, ISBN 9781138244108.

Reviewed by A.C. Paseau, Oxford University


Frege expelled the psychological from the logical. More precisely, he redirected interest away from descriptive-psychological concerns and toward normative ones. Under his influence, philosophers have tended to ask not how we actually reason mathematically or logically, but rather how we ought to reason. In contrast, psychologists and cognitive scientists have vigorously pursued the un- and anti-Fregean investigation of how human beings in fact reason. Their research of the past few decades has generated a wealth of findings and hypotheses about what goes on in mathematical, especially numerical, cognition.

In the name of 'cooperative naturalism', Sorin Bangu has put together a first-rate collection of articles by philosophers and psychologists. Its aim is to draw connections between the two subjects, and in particular, to quote Bangu, to 'encourag[e] the use of the findings of the sciences of cognition in solving philosophical problems' (p. 3). Bangu's is one of the few collections with this laudable aim, an earlier one being a 2007 volume, Mathematical Knowledge, co-edited by the present reviewer, which brought philosophers, mathematicians and psychologists into dialogue. In the introductory chapter, Bangu wisely dispenses with a theoretical justification for his multi-disciplinary approach, and instead hopes to vindicate it by way of its results. In the present climate, such a defence would have been otiose, since we philosophers are all naturalists now. None of us doubts that the empirical sciences have something to teach philosophy; the more interesting question is: how much? More specifically, to what extent can psychological findings buttress or belie a particular philosophical orientation about mathematics or logic?

Suppose, as a philosopher, you wish to explain how we come by arithmetical knowledge. Your starting point might be to explain how we know the (Dedekind-Peano) axioms of arithmetic, and work downstream from there to other truths. For anyone tempted by this approach, Josephine Relaford-Doyle and Rafael Núñez's experiments, described in chapter 13, should come as a bombshell. For their conclusion is that the Dedekind-Peano axioms are inconsistent with most adults' conception of the natural numbers. Excepting those specifically trained in the technique of mathematical induction, most educated adults seem not to think of larger numbers as derived from smaller ones by iterated applications of the successor function, which takes a number N to its successor N+1.

Relaford-Doyle and Núñez's subjects were shown consecutive odd numbers of dots, with the first one occupying the bottom-left 1x1 corner of a 6x6 square, the next three together with the first forming the bottom-left 2x2 square, the next five plus the first four making up the bottom-left 3x3 square, and so on.                                                                                  

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This image is widely thought to be a visual proof of the fact that the sum of the first N odd numbers is equal to N2, for N ranging from 1 to 6. Extrapolating from these six cases, one might infer the more general proposition for all N, which also holds. But how do mathematically untrained subjects fare when asked to generalise the result? It turns out that they are significantly more willing than the mathematically trained to accept the possibility of large-magnitude counterexamples (p. 246). The authors see such resistance as being 'at odds with the system produced by the successor function' (p. 247). Now one might take exception to Relaford-Doyle and Núñez's conclusions, or suspend judgement until their experiments are replicated. I, for one, would have liked to see other diagnoses of where the mathematically untrained go wrong explored more thoroughly. (For example, did they misunderstand the grid structure of the visual proof or the nature of the exercise? That need not rule out their possessing a perfect, if implicit, grasp of the successor function.) But the point here is a conditional one. If they hold up, Relaford-Doyle and Núñez's results cannot but be relevant for mathematical epistemology. To be sure, they would not affect the question of how an idealised subject knows, or might come to know, arithmetical truths. But they surely impact on the question of how the great majority of people know arithmetic, and what exactly it is that they know.

This collection, then, is a welcome addition to the existing literature, and unquestionably succeeds in its main aim of forging connections between the psychology and philosophy of mathematics. Most of the essays are excellent, and are, almost without exception, clear and well written. Each of the essays is self-contained, and while this makes for some repetition, it also allows readers to pick and choose those of most interest. Some more experimental detail would not have been amiss -- much of the psychological work is described summarily -- and a couple of chapters lower the otherwise high quality and dilute the psychology-meets-philosophy focus. But these are minor blemishes, and overall the volume represents a significant achievement.

Many of the essays set off from a core set of experimental findings. A panoply of results seems to indicate that humans as well as some other species are endowed with two fundamental systems for numerical cognition. The first, sometimes called 'the Object-Tracking System', represents numerical magnitudes up to four or five exactly; the second, known as 'the Approximate Number System', allows for inexact representation of greater numbers. Because experiments with neonates and young infants point to the systems being present at or shortly after birth, something of an innatist -- 'Neorationalist' -- consensus in the psychology of numerical cognition has emerged of late.

Some of the original research that helped shape the current framework is presented in a seminal article by Karen Wynn first published in 1995, the only essay in this volume not written specifically for it. It has long been known that we are endowed with the capacity to subitise, namely, discriminate by sight small numbers of objects (up to about five) without counting. Our visual apprehension of numerosities -- the number of some objects -- is automatic, rapid and direct (not inferred). As summarised elsewhere in the volume, this apprehension varies in accuracy in systematic ways similar to perception of other properties (such as illumination or weight), and is similarly affected by exposure to larger collections. Wynn goes much further than this. She argues that infants are capable not only of determining and representing number, but also of carrying out operations on these representations. In particular, she interprets an experiment on five-month-olds as showing that they compute the exact result of operations such as 1 + 1 or 2 - 1. Her 'accumulator mechanism' is a hypothesis about how exactly they might do this.

Neorationalism is currently in the ascendant, then, and the 'blank slate' model of infant numerical competence is in retreat. That is not to say that we are born with a particularly elaborate implicit conception of number. As Kristy vanMarle points out a middle-of-the-road approach between these two extremes seems more promising. Her essay examines afresh some of the experimental evidence, and re-evaluates various hypotheses about the mechanisms subserving our innate numerical faculties. Many of these psychological models, however, still concentrate on the subject as lone inquirer. Yet the acquisition of more sophisticated mathematical concepts occurs within a social context by cultural transmission, a uniquely human phenomenon in its depth and extent, as Helen De Cruz reminds us. De Cruz demonstrates the importance of the role of testimony in the transmission of number concepts, 'both to knowing-how (the skills involved in counting) and to knowing-that (propositional knowledge about number words, such as that they refer to discrete quantities)' (p. 176). Her essay provides a useful corrective to the picture of the preschooler as lone mathematician. It also has striking pedagogical implications: the Montessori method, she intimates, may have gone too far in privileging individual discovery over social learning (p. 168).

Dirk Schlimm argues that an advanced understanding of arithmetic relies on reasoning symbolically with representations of numbers external to the subject. The opposite view, roughly, is that numerical operations are carried out using the Approximate Number System. External representations of a number by, say, an Indo-Arabic numeral, Roman numeral, icon, or word, should therefore only affect the numerical input's transcoding. Once the external input has been mapped onto the Approximate Number System, its original form ought to no longer matter. Reviewing the literature, however, Schlimm casts doubt on this hypothesis. One study, for instance, suggests that the structure of the verbal number system affects numerical competence to a far greater degree than would be implied by a mere transcoding effect. Thus, German-speaking children carry out some verbally-presented numerical operations more slowly than Italian-speaking ones because many number words in German invert the natural word-order, whereas Italian number words do not. (For example, 23 in German is dreiundzwanzig, literally three-and-twenty, whereas it is ventitré in Italian, literally twenty-three). Schlimm concludes that 'the use of numerals and other formal systems of representations is constitutive for the development of an advanced conception of numbers' (p. 213), an observation pregnant with philosophical implications. Schlimm does not spell out exactly what these implications might be, though perhaps he has a connection with formalist epistemologies of mathematics in mind.

Byeong-uk Yi tries to partially solve the 'access problem' (also known as the 'Benacerraf problem'). His approach attempts to modify a well-known discussion of Penelope Maddy's and a related approach proposed by Jaegwon Kim, both of which date from the early 1980s. The 'Maddy-Kim' idea is that we have direct cognitive access to (small) natural numbers, since (for instance) we can just see that a set of pebbles is two-membered. This approach is singularist, in that it takes our perception of number to be perception of a single thing (a set) instantiating a property. In particular, it denies that a property can be instantiated by many things as such. In more detail, the approach is founded on three pillars (p. 53):

The property view of number: Natural numbers (e.g. two) are numerical properties (e.g. being two).

The empirical access thesis: Humans have empirical, and in some cases even perceptual, access to numerical attributes (e.g. being two, being fewer than).

The set property view of numerical property: Numerical properties (e.g. being two) are properties of sets, namely, their cardinality properties (e.g. being two-membered).

Yi notes in passing that some working psychologists also assume the singularist thesis (C). (Incidentally, on page 21 of her essay, discussed below, Maddy makes it clear that she no longer subscribes to (C)). Yi rejects (C) and replaces it instead with something like its pluralist version:

The plural property view of numerical property: Numerical properties (e.g. being two) are properties of things as such.

The attractions of the resulting position are supposed to be many. In particular, it allows numbers to be empirically accessible while denying that sets are. When we see two pebbles, we see that they are 2 rather than 3, and therefore perceptually verify the mathematical proposition 2 ≠ 3; we do not, however, see the set of two pebbles. Yet even if Yi's pluralist revamping of the Maddy-Kim approach succeeds, there is reason to be pessimistic about how far it can take us in addressing the access problem. Numerical perception of this type may inform us that 2 ≠ 3, but it seems incapable of penetrating much further into the mathematical realm.

With Max Jones's essay, the volume hits its stride. A philosopher's guide to recent research in numerical cognition, it contrasts the 'classical' model of perception with the 'ecological' approach pioneered by James J. Gibson. To simplify, on the former model, we represent objects and their properties before inferring their relevance for action. On the latter, we perceive opportunities for action, known as affordances (p. 153). To use Jones's examples, in perceiving a set of stairs, a mug and a chair, we respectively perceive the stairs' climbability, the mug's graspability and the chair's sit-on-ability. He suggests extending this account to numerical perception: we perceive numbers by 'directly perceiving opportunities to engage in enumerative action' (p. 157), that is, opportunities to count objects. Jones then gives a nuanced summary of how, if at all, adopting this account of numerical perception might affect traditional questions in the philosophy of mathematics.

Rolf Reber's contribution is a bold attempt to solve a major philosophical problem. Mathematicians are sensitive to aesthetic features of mathematical arguments, often praising proofs for their beauty. Philosophers might be tempted to account for such judgements by identifying an objective feature of proofs (e.g. simplicity) responsible for the experience. Reber claims instead that processing fluency is the experience underlying such judgements. More generally, he holds that 'an object is seen as beautiful if it can be processed with surprising ease' (p. 253). If psychological findings showed that a proof is deemed beautiful roughly to the extent to which it can be processed fluently, not only would that be a major breakthrough, it would also constitute a clear instance of psychology solving a philosophical problem. Slightly disappointingly perhaps, Reber's chapter is less concerned with what underpins mathematical beauty than with the idea that beauty could be a valid indicator of truth. The argument for the latter hypothesis is roughly that judgements of beauty correlate with processing fluency, which itself correlates with judged truth, which -- in the right environment and for the right type of subject -- in turn correlates with truth. The links here are sufficiently robust that, in spite of the non-transitivity of 'correlates with', beauty 'predicts truth in the context of justification with above-chance accuracy' (p. 256).

Before turning to the psychology of logic, I must briefly mention some other essays focussed on mathematics. Jean-Charles Pelland examines how mature number concepts emerge. As he points out, any account that appeals to external symbols for numbers (e.g. numerals) cannot be fully general, by failing to explain the origin of number concepts prior to these symbols' cultural availability. Although Pelland may not be right in thinking that this imperils an account of how mature concepts emerge in subjects today, it does set a historical challenge for any would-be psychology of mathematical reasoning. Karim Zahidi and Erik Myin agree with the consensus that there are innate mechanisms underpinning our numerical discriminatory abilities. Inspired by Gilbert Ryle, however, they see much of the literature as erring when it takes these abilities to be the product of a 'number sense' -- something driven by conceptual knowledge about numbers.

In a piece brimming with ideas, Mark Fedyk reflects on the role that intuitions play in the epistemology of mathematics. He urges naturalists to make sense of the idea that mathematical statements are akin to scientific statements in being inexactly or approximately true. He also distinguishes between the use of intuitions for learning about representational content (a meaning-directed use) and their use for learning about the world (a world-directed use).

The volume ends with a contribution by Fabio Sterpetti. Expounding and building on recent work of note by Carlo Cellucci, the author argues that the concept of truth as applied to mathematical method should be replaced with that of plausibility. Following Cellucci, Sterpetti contends that mathematics, the natural sciences and philosophy all share the same method -- the so-called Analytic Method. Despite its virtues, this entry, along with a couple of others, does not quite fit in with the volume's main aim of drawing connections between philosophy on the one hand and psychology and cognitive science on the other.

Squarely on topic, Penelope Maddy examines the role that empirical theories can play in the philosophies of logic and of mathematics. Experiments with infants show that they are sensitive to logical structure; for instance, they find conjunctions of correlated features more familiar than conjunctions of uncorrelated ones. Maddy's description of these experimental results is rather brief, but what she wants to emphasise is that our logical beliefs build on the deliverances of 'our primitive cognitive mechanisms' (p. 20). For that reason, for Maddy, it seems that 'the psychology here is showing us why we're so easily inclined to believe that logical truth is necessary, a priori, certain -- a stubborn preconception that vastly distorts our theorizing about it' (p. 21). That seems to me too hasty: it is a long way from our rudimentary logical instincts to our sophisticated, logic-deploying theories. Much more evidence is required to establish path-dependence, that is, to argue that our primitive cognitive mechanisms determine a particular logic, or a narrow range of logics, and correspondingly incline us to the belief that logical truth is necessary, a priori and certain. If the influence of these 'primitive' mechanisms wanes as we grow up and are acculturated into a scientific practice, perhaps our preconceptions do not distort our theorising after all. However things may stand here, Maddy has put her finger on an important issue, deserving of much more attention from both philosophers and psychologists. Her essay concludes with some fascinating observations about whether our intuitive picture of the natural numbers stems from our species' innate language faculty.

Paul D. Robinson and Richard Samuels's joint contribution is the only one to concentrate entirely on logic rather than mathematics. Consider a subject actively deploying the logical rule Modus Ponens. Intentional Rule-Following explanations of this inference (or any other similar one) see it as involving rule-following operations and see rule-following in turn as making use of personal-level rule-representation. Thus, for me to reason by Modus Ponens from the premises A and A → B to the conclusion B, it seems that I must grasp what following Modus Ponens requires, judge that the conditions for its application are satisfied, and on that basis conclude that B is true (given that I take the two premises to be true). If that is right, the performance of an inference requires another prior inference, in which case we are plunged into a vicious regress. The conclusion drawn by critics is that intentional rule-following explanations of inference are impossible.

The flaw in the critics' objection, as Robinson and Samuels point out, is the assumption that the inference from a rule to what the rule calls for under the circumstances must be personal rather than subpersonal. With this assumption dropped, the regress is blocked. Moreover, a potential strengthened regress fails to get off the ground once we note that there is no reason to think that any subpersonal-level inference must involve additional inferential processes. Robinson and Samuels's essay, then, is not a contribution to psychology or to the interpretation of psychological results. Rather, it is a philosophical legitimation of a certain type of psychological explanation. Just as the volume richly illustrates what psychology can do for philosophy, their essay shows how philosophy might return the favour.