Nature and Divinity in Plato's Timaeus

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Sarah Broadie, Nature and Divinity in Plato's Timaeus, Cambridge University Press, 2012, 305pp., $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107012066.

Reviewed by T.K. Johansen, Brasenose College, Oxford


This is an original and profound book. It is also a hard book. The chapters are long and complex, and the argument is multidimensional and far-reaching. Even the reader who is well versed in the Timaeus will be stretched trying to follow Broadie's explorations, but the reward is new vistas of meanings and connections. Anybody interested in the big questions arising from the Timaeus (e.g., the nature of the demiurge, the temporal character of the creation story, the connection between the cosmology and the Atlantis story, the role of the receptacle, the status of the forms) will want to engage (if also sometimes struggle) with this book. While Broadie's ultimate answers are not uncommon (e.g., the creation story is to be read literally, the demiurge is separate from the cosmos, the Atlantis story is an exercise in pseudo-historiography), the arguments she proffers for them are striking and conducted with scrupulous awareness of the best case for the opposition. This is Platonic exegesis of the highest, and most demanding, order.

In this review I shall give a brief summary of each chapter, with a suggestion of a possible line of criticism. But these are slim pickings from a very rich work. Chapter 1 focuses on the separateness of Timaeus' creator god. Broadie highlights the ways in which the Demiurge as a cause differs from the biblical god. First, Timaeus' god does not create the world ex nihilo but from preceding materials. The craftsmanship model thus operates with three factors: cause, matter and product, rather than just cause and product. Second, Timaeus makes the world as perfect as possible and therefore also a god, in a way creating a potential challenge to the demiurge's role as creator. Third, however, the demiurge is a 'one-many' cause (a craftsman can make many products of the same type), while the world-soul he creates is a one-one cause of the world it controls. For 'a cause of the one-many type is separate from any given one of its effects because it is the actual or possible cause of different effects, either in addition to or instead of some given actual effect'. This point underscores the separateness of the demiurge from the world-soul, pace some interpreters.

One question one might raise about this last point is how it squares with the claim that the lesser gods themselves are gods in the cosmos. The lesser gods are themselves demiurges, responsible for the creation of mortal beings, but they are also, as created gods, features of the cosmos itself. If the lesser gods can stand as craftsmen to other entities in the cosmos at the same time as they ensoul parts of the cosmos, i.e. the planets, could one not imagine the Demiurge himself as both creating the cosmos and being in it as its soul? One might counter that the case of the Demiurge is different from that of the lesser gods in that he must stand outside of the cosmos to explain the production of the cosmos in the first place. But apart from the fact that those who identify the demiurge with the cosmic soul typically also read the creation story non-literally (see below for Broadie's reply to this), we might doubt whether Plato would deny, as does Aristotle (De Anima II.4), that a thing can be said to create itself. For Diotima in the Symposium presents the job of erôs as creating another thing such as oneself. In any case, the counter to the objection would rely on a different intuition from the one that a craftsman stands in a one-many relationship to its effect.

Chapter 2 considers the paradigm (eternal vs created) that Timaeus chooses for his cosmology and the consequences of this choice for the status of his account. In a sense, however, this is a non-choice, as any reader of the Republic would recognise that an intelligible paradigm is a given for a genuine craftsman. Broadie argues that Plato, nonetheless, sets up the options to emphasise how the paradigm's eternity ensures the intelligibility of the cosmos. Although his accounts are of course still only likely, being of a likeness of the paradigm, some sets of propositions within the account may have a stronger epistemic status, be more likely than other sections, though they would still all together be more likely than any other theorist's account. Indeed, Timaeus may think that some of his points are close to being irrefutable (as an example, Broadie mentions the propositions that follow directly from the axiom that the world is as beautiful as possible). Cosmology may be a muthos about gods but it is emphatically, for Broadie, a scientific one. This helps, she argues, explain Timaeus' tone of confidence throughout.

Broadie mentions, in passing, the possibility that 'this perceptible universe had not been made according to any model at all' (56), which for Timaeus is not an explicit option. She suggests that the answer to this question is the same as the answer to the question, 'why didn't the demiurge look to a created model?' namely, 'then there would be no cosmology at all'. However, this may seem question begging in relation to an atomistic challenge. Indeed, Broadie elsewhere discusses the danger posed by atomism by the thought that the material elements might on their own have sufficient reality to explain their various motions. There may, however, be another reason why Timaeus does not raise the possibility that the world did not have a craftsman, namely that his basic conception of a proper cause of coming into being is that of an intelligent craftsman. Elsewhere (46d-e) Timaeus underlines that his primary notion of a cause is that of an intelligence. Given this conception of a cause, there are only those two options, the craftsman's having a paradigm that is eternal or one that has come into being. This interpretation would make it more transparent than does Broadie's why at 28a Timaeus moves straight from saying that everything that comes into being must have a cause to specifying the two cases where the demiurge either looks to an eternal or to a created paradigm.

Chapter 3 asks: is Timaeus' account primarily about the physical cosmos with the intelligible paradigm introduced to explain it, where the paradigm bears a relationship to the cosmos somewhat like the recipe for a cake to the cake, or is cosmology rather an indirect way of concerning oneself with the paradigm, a pretext for metaphysics so to speak, where the paradigm is to be studied as an entity in its own right and attention is to be paid also to properties of the paradigm not directly relevant to its role in producing this world? Broadie opts for the former view, but acknowledges the case for the opposition, for example, the plausibility of assimilating the cosmos to the sort of mathematical diagrams discussed in Republic VI, diagrams which are used in order to discuss the mathematical structures themselves. However, she gives more weight to other factors: the way Timaeus' account is introduced as cosmology, its relation to Critias' immersion in human history, to the vast amount of scientific detail which has no direct metaphysical relevance, to Timaeus' suggestion (48c2-d1) that the method of exposition cannot deal with the higher principles, and finally to the way in which the cosmos (not the forms) is worshipped as a god.

Broadie's case against the 'gateway to metaphysics' view seems strong. Passages such 59c-d clearly indicate that the study of the cosmos is distinct from that of being, though it surely requires some familiarity with the forms, since the world has been modelled on them. Broadie's reading also fits well with our sense that no craftsman could be expected to conduct a full and independent study of the paradigm, just those features of the form that are relevant to the artefact in question: the cobbler looks to the form of shoe, but that hardly makes him a metaphysician. Insofar as we are trying to retrace the reasoning of the divine craftsman in making the world, we also will pay attention to those features of being that the world was directly modelled on. One area of obscurity, however, (due to Timaeus' account rather than Broadie's interpretation, though she might have addressed it) arises from the idea that studying the heavenly bodies amounts to a sort of imitation of the rational motions of their souls. For the cosmic soul is engaged in thinking both about being and about perceptible matters, and while it may be doubted whether our imitation of this soul should be restricted to its thinking about being, there is no indication either that our imitation should be limited to its thinking about being to the extent that it provides a model for the perceptible. In other words, imitating the world soul could well look like a gateway to metaphysics understood in the sense that studying cosmology will make us engage in a rational activity that will only be complete, fully like that of the world soul, when we have understood the forms also. Perhaps this is what it means for our souls 'to return to their native stars'.

Chapter 4 considers the composition of mortal living beings and its rationale within the cosmology. Mortal beings are created in order to complete the cosmos, both in the sense that the immortal soul needs a body to complete it and in the sense that the variety of mortal kinds are required to represent fully the paradigm. The lesser gods are brought in here to complete the demiurge's work. (Curiously, however, Broadie translates 41a7 as saying that the demiurge is the father of the lesser gods' works: this is a difficult reading to maintain as it would make the ungenerated god the father of mortal man.) She points to the apparent oddness of the fact that in order to complete the work to make the world as good and rational as possible, the immortal souls are placed in an environment of flux that makes rationality much harder. She addresses the problem by arguing that 'reason's self-development from within a mortal body assaulted by forces not friendly to reason is just the kind of thing without which the world would not be complete' (90). Distinguishing the sort of practical reason involved in dealing with the problems of mortal life also prepares us for the sort of excellence displayed by the agents in the Critias story. Broadie draws attention to the surprising nature of the announcement that there is material left over from the construction of the world soul, which will be used to make the human soul. She contrasts the case of the world soul with that of the world body, whose material was all used up in the first creation of the cosmos. So when we discover that our souls have not been taken from the cosmic soul in the way our bodies borrowed materials from the world body, it comes as a surprise. The important point in this contrast is that our souls as individualized and invested with our various troubles and needs could not be returned to the pool of cosmic soul, whereas the matter of our bodies, since it remains the same for all, may be taken up again by the cosmic body.

This chapter is one of the most brilliant in the book, but on one point Broadie might be overegging the pudding. She suggests also that 'the inferiority of the [soul-material] presumably reflects the fact that the souls is destined for life under conditions of mortal difficulty' (103 with n.41), specifically so that mortal parts, bodily and psychological, could be attached to it, for if the soul was perfect like the world-soul such additions would not stick. However, this claim may seem unwarranted. For the ability of the soul to acquire psychological and bodily parts seems to arise as a consequence of the turmoil the soul experiences when humanly embodied, that is, as a function of the irrational affections the soul suffers upon embodiment, rather than as a function of any inferior rationality that characterised the soul prior to embodiment. The creation of bodily and psychological parts (properly speaking) is the result of the lesser gods' beneficent work on these irrational affections (69cff.), so the pre-embodied soul's relative inferiority is hardly the answer to the question why these parts 'stick'.

If the question is raised why the human soul is susceptible to division and embodiment at all, then the answer seems to go back to what is said about soul in general: soul has an admixture of the sorts of being, sameness and difference which are divisible around bodies (35a). One may think, therefore, that if per impossibile the world soul had been put in a human body, it too would have undergone similar irrational affections and would thereby have acquired the potential for having parts of a similar kind. (Compare the parallels between the creation of the world body and the head: so far the motions in both cases are all circular, now add the human body and all hell breaks loose, 43a-44d). An easier alternative to Broadie's suggestion may be to say that the inferior mixture of our souls explains why our rationality, even at the best of times, is not as well attuned as the cosmic, and that is why the cosmic soul is always a paradigm of rationality for us.

Chapter 5 explores connections between the cosmology and the pseudo-historiography in what Broadie calls 'the Timaeus-Critias complex'. Socrates' presence, together with the notion that the speeches are given in return for Socrates' earlier account, gives the seal of approval to cosmology and historiography, as a new direction in Academic philosophy, while his backseat role underlines their difference from Socrates' own form of philosophy. Since the city engaged in battle is identified with Socrates' ideal city, it is necessarily pseudo-history, although it still belongs to history as dealing with human actions of the past. Broadie gives special significance to the absence of any mention of the battle of Marathon. Since it is such an obvious historical parallel to the Atlantis story, she infers that failure to refer to it shows that it does not exist in what she calls the 'dialogue world' (as distinct from the world of the reader). In contrast, the Atlantis story is true relative to the dialogue world, but patently fictional in relation to the real world of the reader. The absence of Marathon, moreover, reads to Broadie not only as a snub to the supposed glories of real-world Athens, but also as a criticism of the use of historical particulars as paradigms of the politically ideal, in contrast to Socrates' correct use of a formal model for his kallipolis. Finally, the comparison to Marathon implies that Plato could not have meant the Atlantis story to eulogise Socrates' ideal city to his readers, since they would have known that an Athens very different from Socrates' city was sufficient to achieve a similar victory.

How far one follows Broadie in this reasoning will no doubt depend on one's taste for arguments from silence. Broadie suggests that Marathon isn't mentioned by the characters because it doesn't 'exist' in their world. But why should the characters' reason not simply be that Marathon does not merit mention because it does not illustrate the virtuous city in action? Broadie's point that Marathon shows how you don't need the kallipolis in order to achieve a great victory seems beside the point, exactly because none of the characters would think that this Athens is the kallipolis. For this there is no substitute for the Atlantis story, as Socrates says (26e5-6), a war which by the standard of 'the greatest war' in any case quite overshadows not just Marathon, but also the Peloponnesian and Trojan wars.

Broadie's distinction between the dialogue world and the real world clearly raises very fundamental issues about how to read Plato. One set of questions concern the reader's relationship to the distinction. Broadie says that 'we are free to suppose that in the Marathon-free dialogue-world "Socrates" never goes on trial and lives to be eighty-five ' (133). (Why stop at eighty-five?) But how does the reader construct the dialogue world without projecting at least some implicit historical context? Think of our ability to grasp Plato's stage settings and choice of characters such as Theaetetus or Phaedo for the eponymous dialogues. And does it not matter to Plato whether Socrates' rejection of democracy also reads to the Athenian reader as a rejection of the historical Athenian democracy?

Another related set of questions concerns the dialogues' relationship to each other. Where do other dialogues stand to the dialogue world of the Timaeus, say? Who is this Socrates who declares, for example, that it should cause no surprise that he is incapable of praising his own citizens properly (19a2-3)? Is this not an oblique reference to his own lack of political experience? How do we give any content to such aversions if we are not allowed to flesh out the character (if not to the 'historical' Socrates) using other dialogues such as the Apology or Republic, dialogues that don't exist, it would seem according to Broadie, for the dialogue world of the Timaeus? Without further clarification, Broadie's distinction seems to have quite radical consequences for how to read Plato. It is worth noting in this context that she herself deliberately makes little use of other dialogues in her reading of the Timaeus, a strategy which affords her considerable interpretative freedom.

Chapter 6 turns to the receptacle. As Broadie analyzes the receptacle passage, the point is not, as is often thought, to give a metaphysical account of how sensible bodies can exist as images of forms. The point is rather to explain a precondition of cosmology. So the passage introduces the receptacle to explain a specific problem about how to understand the four elements and their genesis. Quite opposite to the metaphysical reading's assumption that Plato worries about how the sensible bodies have any being at all, the real worry is why the elementary bodies aren't so real that they do not depend on anything else for their existence and their movements, as the atomists indeed held. If so, there would be no reason to suppose that they were subservient to a purposeful intelligence. Timaeus counters this threat by showing the elements in their joint dependency on the receptacle and on the forms, that is, as dependent on two quite different entities. More specifically, the receptacle is required by cosmology to explain the problem of how the four elements move in separate directions, something we cannot explain simply by reference to their geometrical composition. However, Broadie charges Plato with muddying the waters by also identifying the receptacle with chôra, and so making readers think that the receptacle is primarily meant to present a notion of space or place.

Broadie's interpretation is perhaps best taken as both metaphysical and cosmological, rather than as just cosmological. For to use the receptacle to show the elements' ontological dependence is surely a metaphysical demonstration, in that it amounts to showing that they are not ousiai. Secondly, in characterising the elements in their continued inter-transformation, Timaeus is describing a kind of entity (genos) which becomes. But how compelling is her claim that the receptacle is required to explain the separation of the elements? There are clearly different aspects of Timaeus' account of how the bodies move away from each other: there is the fact that they move, that they move differently, and that they move to different places. Timaeus seems primarily to explain motion in terms of difference (57e). He explains different kinds of movement (quick, slow etc.) in terms of the geometrical properties of the elements (56a-b). So it is not clear that the receptacle is brought in to explain any of these. But what the receptacle does explain, in the image of the winnowing basket (52e), is the motion to different regions. This motion already presupposes the motion of the elements themselves (or in the pre-cosmos their traces).

One might say that the receptacle moves the elements (or the traces) in different ways exactly because it is moved by things that are different. Insofar as the separation happens also before the creation of the cosmos, it cannot be a function of the geometrical attributes which the elements acquire in the cosmogony. Nonetheless, one may think that the separation is a function of the difference between the proto-elements that already existed in the pre-cosmos, where the geometrical composition is a way of mathematically regimenting these differences. Certainly, Broadie is right in any case that the receptacle is required for the motions that separate the elements. But putting greater stress on the character of the elements (or the pre-cosmic traces) in explaining why the receptacle serves to separate their motions may seem to be more in line than Broadie's reading with Timaeus' stress on the passivity as well as the characterlessness of the receptacle itself. The basic point is that in order for us to understand what 'separating' means we need to refer to differences on the formal side, rather than on the side of the formless receptacle. Finally, it seems to me a weakness of Broadie's reading, particularly for what purports to be a cosmological explanation, that it sidelines Timaeus' references to the third kind as 'chôra', not least because place or space appears to be a basic precondition of any motion.

In the final chapter, Broadie addresses the question whether the creation is to be understood literally as a process in and over time. She approaches the issue in terms of the question, what would be lost in terms of cosmology, if one read the account atemporally? She distinguishes three contexts in which Timaeus presents the creation in 'proto-historical' terms: 1) the demiurge imposed order on some previously unordered materials; 2) the creation of the cosmos went through a series of ordered stages; the human body, say, was fashioned by first making bone, then blood, flesh and sinew, then the skin and hair, and so on; finally 3) the creation took place in the past in relation to 'now'; this idea is particularly prominent in the account of the generation of mortal beings: man was first created directly by the gods, while subsequent generations, including ours, arose through reproduction. Broadie's conclusion is that while 1) and 2) could be retained without much difficulty on the ahistorical, 'sempiternalist' interpretation, 3) could not without undermining the central deistic claim that God created the world so that it could subsequently function on its own. Finally, Broadie sees here an internal tension in Timaeus' theory. Operating with only two cosmogonical principles, Intelligence and Necessity, Timaeus' implies that only by going back to Intelligence could we see why the world now came to operate in an ordered way. But Broadie suggests Timaeus' theory of reproduction in effect introduces a third principle, a kind of erôs (the reader is reminded of the Symposium here, see above) which ensures the continuation of the species. But if biological species are now such that they can reproduce without divine assistance, why was it ever not thus? Exit the Demiurge, enter Aristotle's nutritive-reproductive soul. Ultimately, Plato was caught in the Timaeus between a sempiternalist creation story and a less than coherent temporal account.

One issue one might take with Broadie's use of Timaeus' account of reproduction as evidence for a stage where living beings are themselves responsible for the continuation of the species is that this account is couched in the context of a reincarnation story. It is of course right that Timaeus explains the formation of another living creature in terms of the joint action of the female appetite and the male love (91c-d), though to what extent this is said pars pro toto is unclear. However, there is no emphasis on the offspring being of the same sort as the parents (as in Aristotle and in the Symposium). More importantly, the account of biological reproduction leads straight on (91d5ff) to the story about metempsychosis. In this story, the soul, first of all, is not reproduced: it's the same soul that gets reincarnated. And secondly an animal body, say that of a bird, can be born to house the soul of what was a human being. If the soul is not reproduced, and the soul of a human may find itself reincarnated in an avian body, or any other body for that matter, it is surely hard to recognise an independent system of biological reproduction, one which doesn't require in some way the hand of god. Broadie may still be right, that this stage of reproduction/reincarnation must be distinct from the stage when the human soul and body were first created. For the reincarnation happens now according to laws that were explained by god before our first generation so that we ourselves would be responsible for our fortunes in future generations (41e-42d). But this is a point that seems to go back to the divine Intelligence, and not one that points in the direction of Aristotle's nutritive-reproductive soul.