Nature and Experience: Phenomenology and the Environment

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Bryan E. Bannon (ed.), Nature and Experience: Phenomenology and the Environment, Rowman and Littlefield, 2016, 242 pp., $127.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781783485208.

Reviewed by Jonathan Maskit, Denison University


Environmental philosophy, like much of philosophy, is methodologically fractured. For many years the dominant strain has been environmental ethics, an approach that seeks to provide the normative grounding for environmental concern. Many environmental ethicists have debated how best to conceive of nature -- holistically, ecosystemically, as species, as individuals, etc. -- as well as what it is about nature conceived in this way that makes it morally considerable. A number of assumptions lie in the background of this approach. First is that there is a meaningful distinction to be drawn between human moral subjects and nature as an object, or set of objects, that may be deserving of moral consideration, even if incapable of reciprocal moral agency. Second is that both sides of this first distinction -- nature and the human -- are more or less fixed or stable, which is to say that there are two natures: nature and human nature. Of course, these distinctions are also often quickly problematized. First, there are continuing questions as to whether we ourselves are part of nature or not. In the first case, everything we do is natural; in the second, nothing we do is. Second, the entire enterprise of environmental philosophy is motivated by the obvious fact that nature, unless it is conceived as a system of laws, does not stand apart from humanity, but has been affected by human actions for hundreds, if not thousands of years. Nevertheless, that we are at bottom dealing with two distinct "things" -- humanity and nature -- continues to be the starting place for much of environmental philosophy.

It is exactly this starting point that Bryan Bannon's excellent collection calls into question. This far-ranging collection is made up predominantly of work that begins in the phenomenological tradition of Husserl, Heidegger, and Merleau-Ponty. All three of these European thinkers begin not with a given human subject, but with experience, and so too do the essays in this volume. If we begin with experience, rather than presupposing both that there is a subject who experiences and a world that is to be experienced, we find that what it is to be nature depends on us just as much as what it is to be us depends upon nature. Were this book a monograph I would continue this theme, but it is likely more useful for readers to know something about the chapters of the book, so it is to them that I turn.

The collection has three parts: "Phenomenology of Nature," "Metaphor, Agency, and the Human Relation to Nature," and "Practicing Phenomenology." The first section's five chapters explicitly take up phenomenology as a methodology for environmental philosophy, and in particular as a way to grapple with the question "what is nature?" The second section takes up various issues in environmental philosophy: global warming, nature's agency, and whether there is one right way to do environmental philosophy. The final section offers more fine-grained applications of phenomenology in the social sciences, reworkings of ecosystem services and environmental justice, and some issues from environmental aesthetics.

The essays by Tom Greaves and by Bannon (the volume's editor) most explicitly present phenomenological arguments for starting with experience as a way to address the various issues that arise when we begin with the sort of subject/object dualism so common in much environmental philosophy. In "Natural Phenomena: The Birth and Growth of Experience," Greaves argues that the distinction we so easily (naturally!) draw between nature and non-nature, whether in philosophy or everyday life, is a problematic starting point. Rather than asking "what is nature?" we would do better to begin with experience and pay attention to how it begins and develops, or is born and grows, to use Greaves' terms. As experience grows, it often intensifies (one might think of the musical development and intensification of a piece such as Ravel's Bolero). Such intensified experience, often so intense that it overwhelms, is, for Greaves, nature.

Bannon, in "Nature, Meaning, and Value," argues that phenomenology can give a better account of our relationship to the natural world, by making the very constituents of that relationship dependent on the relationship. That is, rather than seeing the world as constituted of experiencing subjects and experienced objects, he argues for a world constituted of bodies, all of which can experience and, through that relational experiencing, become beings of particular types. Thus phenomenology, for Bannon, is very much not a philosophy of the subject. Indeed, he argues that "it is, at least not absurd to think about a phenomenology of an animal's experience, a plant's or even a rock's" (61). Here it seems that in the rush to overcome the various dualisms of modernity, Bannon ends up with an undifferentiated realm of being in which all aspects are capable of experience. Nevertheless, with its emphasis on a shared world of experience, Bannon makes a compelling case for thinking of environmental philosophy as more like a realm of friendship rather than as one in which we, as subjects, have moral obligations to a world that is, in principle, incapable of reciprocity.

Bryan Smyth's and Janet Donohoe's chapters are the most technical, drawing not only inspiration from the phenomenological tradition, but sticking closely to Husserl's methods. Smyth, in "Mythic Enlightenment: Phenomenology and the Question Concerning Nature," uses Husserl's transcendental phenomenology to make the case that "nature is best conceived in the idiom of myth, understood as a dynamic narrative horizon of significance" (3). His goal is to rethink nature so that environmental ethicists might avoid the "conceptual trap" (6) of thinking of nature as something that is ultimately fixed and thus knowable, a conception that has led some, e.g., Stephen Vogel, to reject the value of nature in environmental philosophy. Donohoe too, in "Towards a Phenomenology of Nature," argues that we should think of nature as a horizon of experience, i.e., as "something that makes our experiences possible" (18). Donohoe appeals to genetic phenomenology to make the case that nature, as part of the lifeworld, does not present itself as something that can be known objectively. Instead, there are "layers upon layers of tradition and history that compose our way of being, way of doing and way of thinking" (26). If we broaden the lifeworld to include nature, we can quickly see that nature too must be layered in a similar way.

In "Phenomenology and the Charge of Anthropocentrism" (the most insider baseball of the essays in this first part of the collection), Simon James argues that, first (mis)impressions notwithstanding, Merleau-Ponty's phenomenology, and by extension phenomenology of nature, is not anthropocentric, either axiologically or ontologically. The first of these holds that nature may exist independently, but has no value independent of human valuers; the second holds that nature itself only exists as some sort of construction. James's primary concern is to defend phenomenology from critics such as Quentin Meillassoux, who hold that phenomenology is ontologically anthropocentric. To make his case, James argues that, contrary to appearances, Merleau-Ponty is not a strong correlationist, i.e., one for whom "the notion of a world that is not a world for any possible subject makes no sense" (46). Because of the role of flesh in Merleau-Ponty's thought, as well as the place of useful engagement in the world, James argues that it makes no sense to call him a strong correlationalist and therefore Merleau-Ponty also cannot be an ontological anthropocentrist.

Part II, "Metaphor, Agency, and the Human Relation to Nature," has two chapters that take up issues having to do with climate change (by Mark Thorsby and by Elise Springer), one on ecofeminism and nature's agency (by Tim Christion Myers), and one on meandering rivers and meandering thought (by Irene Klaver).

In "Intersubjectivity, the Environment, and Moral Failure," Thorsby begins with the problem of moral failure, whereby everyone and no one is responsible for environmental harms. However, it quickly becomes clear that Thorsby is interested in a sort of moral contradiction, whereby "actions that threaten the existentiality of the world are . . . [themselves] morally contradictory" (70). The contradiction, which is marked by a sense of tragedy, arises because "moral failure is the unavoidable result of [socially constituted] agents' attempts to fulfill their moral duty" (75). For example, when a climatologist flies for her research, she, in fulfilling her duty as a climatologist, unavoidably makes worse the problem she is attempting to address. For Thorsby, industrial culture as a whole is riven with moral failure, and its attendant tragedy, as it perpetuates a set of behaviors that inevitably undercut the "natural" material conditions that make that culture possible. To address this issue, he argues, rightly I think, that environmental philosophers would do better to cease discussing the value of nature and to ask, instead, "what sorts of values [their social] world concretely embodies" (78).

Springer's "Metaphor and Weather: Thinking Ecologically about Metaphor, Experience, and Climate," argues, in a text that vibrates with the textual reality of metaphor, that metaphor is key to addressing climate change. However, she warns us that the search for the one right metaphor or the one right set of metaphors is doomed to failure. Metaphors, for Springer, form a crucial part of our interaction with the world in a way that simultaneously shapes what that world is and can be for us, while shaping us as part of that world. Metaphor is thus a sort of "feral unmanageability" (87), an indicator species for language's uncontrollability. In the end Springer's point (although the paper points toward far broader applicability) is that climate change requires not the right metaphors to describe phenomena that simply are, but an awareness that whatever metaphors we use will shape what the phenomena themselves are, and thus our possible responses to those phenomena.

In a similar vein, Irene J. Klaver's "Re-Rivering Environmental Imagination: Meander Movement and Merleau-Ponty" takes up meandering, both in water and in thought, and the prefix re-, in particular in terms such as "re-connecting, re-imagining, re-valuing and re-vitalizing" (113). These terms, when taken together in reference to a river, e.g., the Los Angeles River, that has been forgotten, covered over, or even denied, she calls re-rivering. Klaver reminds us that human settlements have always been built on or near water, often rivers, and that rivers have played crucial roles in transportation, warfare, and the like. More importantly, rivers have been sources both of water and of inspiration, in particular for poetry. Klaver treats meandering -- named for the Meander River in Turkey -- as a crucial movement in thought and life. Rivers, in their flowing, sometimes lay down sediment and sometimes scour it away. Interestingly, it is exactly this image of sedimentation and reactivation that Merleau-Ponty uses as a metaphor for philosophy. For Klaver, then, the work of re-rivering can serve to foster not only the river and its biology but also the culture of thinking.

Tim Christion Myers, in "Ecofeminism, Ecophenomenology, and the Metaphorics of Nature's Agency," proposes using ecophenomenology to respond to Val Plumwood's and Carolyn Merchant's calls to give nature agency. He concludes that "without reworking the 'everyday metaphysics' that secretly determine how we make sense of social and socioecological relationships, the monological demands for unambiguous consistency will continue to polarize our thinking and being in the world at the expense of dialogical mutualism" (111).

Part III, "Practicing Phenomenology," is a bit eclectic. It begins with "Paradigms, Praxis and Environmental Phenomenology" by Ingrid Leman Stefanovic, Zachary Shefman, and Kristina Welch, who argue for the value of phenomenology, broadly understood, in the social sciences. While quantitative methods may produce what appear to be factual results, it is often at the price of blurring useful accounts of experience that may well have been discovered with a phenomenological approach. Their concern is that quantitative research, like armchair philosophizing, presupposes too much a priori about what is to be studied or explained. By contrast, "to engage in phenomenological thinking is to illumine concrete, everyday taken-for-granted ways of being-in-the-world rather than to fabricate theoretical constructs" (131).

Barbara Muraca and Kyle Powys Whyte independently argue for reconsidering some well-established concepts in environmental philosophy. Muraca's "Re-appropriating the Ecosystem Services Concept for a Decolonization of 'Nature'" hearkens back to some of the themes discussed in Part I, but now in a more applied way. She argues that both environmental destruction and environmentalism are rooted in the same modern ontology of nature, which sees nature and culture (or nature and subject) as opposites: "The necessary outcome of this bifurcation was on the one side a fixed and objectified nature, which can no longer 'speak' except through . . . scientific channels, and on the other a free, self-creative and detached subject" (146). The notion of ecosystem services, which is usually thought to fit smoothly into this ontology, presents the possibility of overcoming the nature/culture divide through the notion of an essential relationality, which precedes and grounds both nature and subject.

In "Indigenous Experience, Environmental Justice and Settler Colonialism," Whyte argues for a new conception of environmental justice. Many views of environmental justice hold that it has simply to do with the inequitable distribution of environmental harms and benefits. Whyte, however, argues that environmental injustice occurs for indigenous communities when their forms of experience, understanding, and political organization are interrupted by settler colonialists who seek to make the indigenous people's environment their own, imposing the settlers' forms of experience, understanding, and political organization on the territory while denying the validity of the indigenous community's practices. "Environmental injustice," he writes, "can be seen as an affront to peoples' capacities to experience themselves in the world as having responsibilities for the upkeep, or continuance, of their societies" (165).

The final two chapters both deal with aesthetics. David E. Cooper's "Music and the Presence of Nature," like Muraca's chapter, returns to themes from part one. He argues for the importance of the arts in general, and music in particular, in shaping our experience of nature. Music, he argues, is a "special case of a larger codependence between culture and nature." This codependence, for Cooper, means that "cultural practices and perceptions are always already shaped by how nature is encountered, just as ways of encountering nature are always already shaped by cultural traditions" (183). Cooper illustrates various ways in which music, although often overlooked, serves as an important part of this codependency, whether in the making of instruments, the siting of musical practices, or the natural inspiration for musical compositions.

The collection concludes with Guðbjörg Rannveig Jóhannesdóttir's "Phenomenological Aesthetics of Landscape and Beauty." Jóhannesdóttir argues that a phenomenological aesthetics can provide important insights into environmental values that escape our attempts at quantification. Such a relational aesthetics "allows us to see that there is no separation between humans and nature, subject and object" (198). In other words, here too we see how phenomenology can serve to overcome some of the central dualisms that have bedeviled environmental philosophy and policy.

This collection deserves to be read not just by those working in "continental" environmental philosophy but also by environmental philosophers more broadly. Its clear, well-written essays grapple with and reconceptualize some of the area's key questions, and do so in novel and refreshing ways. Many of them would work well even in an undergraduate environmental philosophy course, and could bring something really new to such a setting.