Nature and Necessity in Spinoza's Philosophy, Oxford University Press

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Don Garrett, Nature and Necessity in Spinoza's Philosophy, Oxford University Press, 2018, 533pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780195307771.

Reviewed by  Michael Della Rocca, Yale University


On November 13, 2000, the surviving members of the Beatles released the album 1, a collection of all the chart-topping hits the Beatles created in their exceptional career. Prima facie, there was really no need for this album, for one might ask: Weren't these songs still so familiar and so popular, even the songs from early in the Beatles' career such as "She Loves You"? But, perhaps defying expectations, the album 1 was itself a best-selling success around the world and deepened and extended the admiration of Beatles' fans -- old and new -- for an amazing body of work.

In much the same way, I want to suggest, there may initially seem to be no need for a collection of all of Don Garrett's "greatest hits" on Spinoza. Because Garrett's papers are very often timeless gems with which so many of us are already familiar, there may seem to be no call for such a collection. But, as with the Beatles and 1, such initial expectations are defeated. This collection, like the Beatles' collection, promises to deepen and extend the admiration of Garrett's fans -- old and new -- for an amazing body of work. And, unlike the Beatles' collection, which contains no fresh contributions, Garrett's collection includes several new instant classics -- four substantial postscripts -- which defend and develop his earlier contributions. These postscripts remind us that, unlike the Beatles who sadly are no longer able to create songs together, Garrett is still bringing forth new essays on Spinoza to which we can look forward.

In this review, I want to focus first on the title of Garrett's volume and, in particular, on the term "nature" ("natura" in Spinoza's Latin). For Spinoza, God is nature itself, and thus God is paradigmatically natural and not supernatural. This nature that is God is, for Spinoza, a substance. Spinoza's explanation of the notion of substance, as Garrett himself explains, is that substance is that which is in itself (in se) and is conceived through itself (per se concipitur).[1] Being in se is helpfully understood by Garrett as inherence and indicates a kind of ontological self-sufficiency. Being conceived through itself indicates a kind of conceptual self-sufficiency, the self-explanatoriness or self-intelligibility of God. As Garrett stresses in a number of the essays, this independence enjoyed by God or nature is just the fact that God's power is unconstrained. God, God's power, God's ontological self-sufficiency, God's conceptual self-suffficiency, God's self-explanatoriness are, for Garrett's Spinoza, somehow all the same. As self-sufficient in these ways, this nature that is God is itself -- to invoke Garrett's other titular notion -- necessary. This power, this self-sufficiency is expressed in infinitely many different attributes, for Spinoza, among which are thought and extension (the other attributes are in some way unknown to us thinking and extended beings). So God is (or less happily "has") a thinking nature, an extended nature, etc.

Not only is it true that God is (or has) a nature, but the same is also true of each thing, such as you, me, the dog, and the table. And, by contrast to the nature of God, the natures of other things -- so-called modes of God -- include being ontologically and conceptually dependent on something else, ultimately on God (1def5). This dependence on God is manifested in laws that govern all natural things, i.e., all things. These laws, for Garrett's Spinoza, follow from or are dictated by the nature of God conceived under one of the attributes. Because all things are governed by the same laws -- the laws of nature -- that is, because, as I like to put it, everything for Spinoza plays by the same rules, Spinoza is a naturalist. For Garrett, invoking appropriately the Preface to Part 3 of the Ethics, Spinoza's naturalism is the thesis that everything, including human beings, is governed by and explained by the same general principles (p. 405). Nothing is supernatural or extra-natural.

Not only is God's nature necessary, but the relation of following from God's nature is also necessary. Thus, all things -- or, perhaps, all facts or, perhaps, all truths -- are necessary. This is the thesis of necessitarianism which, in Garrett's eyes, Spinoza embraces. Some have tried to soften this view and to tone down the necessity by allowing that, although each fact for Spinoza is determined by a fact or facts, Spinoza nonetheless in some way allows for other possible total series of modes and thus allows for a robust kind of contingency. However, Garrett will have none of this watering-down of Spinoza's views on modality. His excellent 1991 paper, "Spinoza's Necessitarianism" (included in this volume) persuasively makes the case that Spinoza is a necessitarian. This paper has led to much discussion and been embraced by many (including me), but has also been challenged by others including especially Edwin Curley and Greg Walski in their prominent 1999 paper, "Spinoza's Necessitarianism Reconsidered".[2] One of the most welcome features of Garrett's volume is a long postscript to his 1991 paper, a postscript in which he offers a detailed response to each of Curley and Walski's main points in favor of a non-necessitarian reading. Garrett's key thought here is that, although it is true that finite modes are and must be caused by other finite modes (and by infinite modes), this causation by other modes is not, as non-necessitarian interpreters would have it, in addition to the causal role played by the attributes, but is rather an expression of those very attributes. As Garrett puts the point, "the causal power of each mode is a share of, rather than distinct from, the causal power of the attributes themselves" (p. 130).

A further key point that Garrett invokes is that to say, as Curley and Walski do, that the attributes by themselves do not suffice for all modes would be to accept a violation of the Principle of Sufficient Reason (the PSR): why, we might ask, does this series obtain instead of another one (p. 125)? It seems that the non-necessitarian reading runs afoul of Spinoza's commitment to the PSR, a commitment expressed, as Garrett argues, in axioms 2 and 4 of part 1 of the Ethics (p. 55).

In the postscript to this paper, Garrett also makes another astute challenge to the non-necessitarian reading: if, as Curley and Walski hold, the attributes were not causally sufficient for actual finite modes, then God could be only (in Spinoza's sense) an "inadequate" cause of the modes (p. 128). And, given Spinoza's view that something that is an inadequate cause is acted on by other things (3def2), then it would follow, as Garrett correctly says, that God would be acted on. And this would surely be intolerable for Spinoza.

Moving back from necessity to nature, we can raise a potential challenge to Spinoza: isn't the very fact that there are both dependent beings -- modes -- and an independent being -- substance or God -- itself a threat to naturalism? Modes are by nature other-dependent and substance is by nature not other-dependent. Modes and substance thus seem to play by different rules. How is this compatible with Spinoza's naturalism, as Garrett defines it? In his paper, "Spinoza's Conatus Argument" (2002), Garrett eases this threat considerably and brilliantly by showing how, for Spinoza, finite things and modes generally are "quasi-substances", things that enjoy a degree of self-sufficiency and independence, even if not the full measure of self-sufficiency and independence that God enjoys. This status emerges most clearly in Garrett's discussion of Spinoza's conatus doctrine. For Spinoza, each thing -- insofar as it is in itself (quantum in se est) -- strives (conatur) to persevere in its being (3p6) and thus is, to this extent, powerful. This striving is, for Spinoza, the actual essence of each thing (3p7). As Garrett points out, this striving is a function of the extent to which a thing is in se, in itself. As we saw, being in se is one of the defining features of substance (and thus of God). So, as Garrett incisively shows, Spinoza's point in 3p6 is literally that to the extent that a thing is a substance, it strives to persist. We have here a manifestation of what Garrett later calls Spinoza's incremental naturalism. Spinoza's naturalism, as we have seen, is the thesis that everything, including human beings, is governed by and explained by the same general principles. Spinoza's naturalism is incremental because the properties that enter into these explanations are not simply present or absent, but rather are treated "as properties and relations that are pervasively present to greater or lesser degrees" (p. 405). In this case, the power manifested in the striving that is pervasive in nature comes in varying degrees. Each thing is thus powerful to some degree and, of course, God or substance is supremely powerful. Thus, the threat to naturalism is removed: modes and substance do not play by different rules; rather, their activities are all to be understood as manifestations of the pervasive rule that dictates that things be as powerful as possible.

Garrett deploys, to great effect, this incremental version of naturalism in understanding Spinoza's philosophy of mind. For Spinoza, the more independent a mind is, the more conscious it is (pp. 408-10). Each idea and thus each mind (for each mind is nothing but a complex idea) is conscious to some degree; God is the most conscious thinking thing. Consciousness is thus an incremental feature. In an illuminating postscript to his paper, "Representation and Consciousness in Spinoza's Naturalistic Theory of the Imagination" (2008), Garrett deals with important objections by Steven Nadler and Mike LeBuffe to his account of consciousness in terms of power.

Indeed, for Garrett's Spinoza, logic itself is to be understood in these incremental terms: the logic of an idea or thought is not something over and above its content, not a matter of mere form; instead, logic is a matter of powerful ideas causing other ideas in virtue of their content. As Garrett puts it, "Logic for Spinoza is chiefly a matter of powerful ideas causing other ideas in virtue of their content, rather than of propositions entailing other propositions in virtue of their form" (p. 53). For Garrett's Spinoza, ideas have varying degrees of power, and logic is simply a matter of the greater or lesser power that ideas have in virtue of their content. Here again incremental naturalism is at work.

With the notion of more or less powerful mental states and more or less powerful things in general, and with the connected notion of striving, Garrett sees Spinoza as embracing genuinely teleological explanations that, as Garrett puts it, explain a "state of affairs by indicating a likely or presumptive consequence (causal, logical, or conventional) of it that is implicated in the state's origin or etiology" (p. 321). For Garrett, Spinoza "fully and consistently accepts the legitimacy of many teleological explanations" (p. 323). And, for Garrett, these teleological explanations are a direct implication of Spinoza's conatus doctrine: simply because modes strive to do things, they engage in end-directed activity. Thus, Garrett says, "the underlying phenomenon of action for ends is itself . . . pervasive throughout nature" (p. 325). At the same time, Garrett sees Spinoza as rejecting divine teleology: God acts, but does not act for the sake of an end in the way that modes do or can. The teleological activity which modes engage in is not necessarily conscious or thoughtful, but it is action for the sake of an end, action guided by an end. In this way, for Garrett in "Teleological Explanation in Spinoza and Early Modern Rationalism" (1999), Spinoza accepts a more thoroughgoing kind of teleology than any of his prominent early modern contemporaries and he has a more Aristotelian approach to such matters than any of them. This defense of a teleological interpretation of Spinoza and this take on teleology in early modern philosophy has generated considerable discussion. Garrett does not engage in this collection with some of these responses to his paper (there's no postscript to this paper), and I look forward to an occasion on which he grapples with some of the challenges that scholars (such as John Carriero and Paul Hoffman) have raised.[3]

Let me raise one thought about Garrett's take on teleology in Spinoza. Garrett explicitly sees Spinoza's conatus doctrine as presupposing teleology. However, it is not clear why this doctrine needs to be so interpreted. One way to see this point is to note that Descartes sees bodies as striving. Descartes in this context uses the same term that Spinoza does: forms of the word "strive". In particular, for Descartes, bodies strive to remain in the same state. For Descartes, as he makes clear in Principles III 56 and elsewhere, this bodily striving is explicitly not teleological (it's also not psychological). As I have argued elsewhere,[4] Spinoza's notion of conatus seems to be modeled on this austere Cartesian notion of striving. The question is: should we see Spinoza's conatus as teleological or as -- more in keeping with its Cartesian inspiration -- not teleological?

There are many, many other riches in Garrett's volume: we find compelling interpretations of infinite modes in Spinoza, of intuitive knowledge in Spinoza, and of his ethical theory, etc. But I want to turn finally to the most direct connection between Garrett's collection and the Beatles' album 1: Spinoza's monism, his claim that there is one substance. Among Garrett's papers in this volume, perhaps none have been more influential than the two devoted to Spinoza's substance monism. First, "Spinoza's 'Ontological' Argument" -- written when Garrett was a graduate student at Yale and published in the Philosophical Review in 1979 -- and also "Ethics Ip5: Shared Attributes and the Basis of Spinoza's Monism" (1990).

The opening section of Part I of Spinoza's Ethics­ -- up to Proposition 14 -- is an exceedingly compressed and rich argument for the claim that there is only one substance or fundamental thing in the world, viz., the world or nature itself, viz., God. As Spinoza puts the point in 1p14: "Except God, no substance can be or be conceived". This opening stretch of text in the Ethics has perennially captivated and baffled students of Spinoza and, for many of these students of Spinoza, the best guide through this labyrinth has been -- and is -- this pair of papers by Garrett. Garrett succeeds in identifying the most fruitful questions or problems to raise about Spinoza's line of thought and in giving us productive methods for addressing these problems and in offering provocative solutions to them. One of the difficulties that Garrett identifies for Spinoza here is this: Spinoza argues that no two substances can share an attribute. That is, there can be at most one extended substance, one thinking substance, etc. Spinoza goes on to argue that God (defined as the substance with each attribute) exists and thus that since, by 1p5, there can be no sharing of attributes between substances and since God has them all, no other substance exists. God, in effect, corners the market on attributes and "squeezes out" all other would-be substances.

In "Spinoza's 'Ontological' Argument", Garrett asks the question (I believe he was the first to ask it in these terms): why couldn't Spinoza equally well have argued instead that since, say, a substance with extension as its only attribute exists, and since there can be no sharing of attributes, it follows that God -- who is defined as having all the attributes including extension -- does not exist. From the perspective of this counterpart argument, this substance -- call it "ES1" -- would "squeeze out" God (instead of vice versa). But that would, of course, be disastrous for Spinoza. Garrett's question, in effect, is: why is Spinoza justified in ruling out the existence of a substance with only one attribute, such as extension? Without an answer to this innovative question, Garrett argues, Spinoza's entire basis for the claim that God exists and is the only substance collapses. This is a neat problem and Garrett's solution is equally neat, relying as it does on the underexplored Spinozistic notion of power to exist and also on Spinoza's obvious reliance on a version of the PSR. In seeing the PSR as playing a pivotal role here, Garrett is able to reach the deep insight that Spinoza's argument for the existence of God is "an ontological argument which relies on the principle of sufficient reason" (p. 50), a principle usually associated with the cosmological argument and not the ontological argument. On a personal note, I am happy to say that it was Garrett's use of the PSR in this context that eventually helped to open up my eyes to the pervasive role of the PSR in Spinoza's thought.

I happen to think that Garrett's solution to this problem that he masterfully raises does not work. Indeed, in one of the postscripts in the volume, he directly challenges my reason for thinking that his solution fails. This is not the occasion for me and Garrett to have it out. Rather, I would like to take this opportunity to begin to explore a fascinating and important methodological point that Garrett makes both in a footnote to "Spinoza's 'Ontological' Argument" (pp. 51-52, note 10) and in the postscript to this paper. I argue[5] that the best way to avoid the problem that Garrett raises is to reject the existence of a substance with only one attribute, e.g., extension (again, call this substance "ES1"), by appealing to the PSR in a certain way. ES1 does not exist because its existence would, given what I call the explanatory barrier that Spinoza erects between the attributes, be a brute fact. And, given the PSR, brute facts are ruled out. Thus, for me, the PSR itself provides a reason for the non-existence of ES1. Garrett claims that this appeal to the PSR is subject "to a damaging methodological objection" (p. 60). Garrett's worry is this: the PSR is a "universal generalization about the existence of sufficient reasons." As such, the PSR "cannot properly quantify over itself by treating its own purported truth as an infallible second-order back-up reason in the absence of any first-order reasons for a state of affairs." Rather,

it can only affirm the universal existence of substantive explanatory reasons that are independent of its own alleged truth as a universal generalization about explanatory reasons. If it were to be allowed to quantify over itself, its truth as a quantification could not properly be fixed until its truth as an instance of itself were fixed and vice versa. (p. 61)

Garrett's claims here deserve extended discussion, but I would like to engage briefly and directly with his intriguing methodological point. For Garrett, the PSR is not itself a first-order reason for a particular state of affairs. This is one upshot of Garrett's claim that the PSR cannot quantify over itself. In this light, we might say that, for Garrett, the PSR provides -- or is -- the form of explanation itself, a universal feature that can, as it were, be abstracted from particular explanations, but does not itself provide the (first-order) content of particular explanations.

But, I ask, why should Spinoza accept this version of the form/content distinction? Garrett, as we saw, sees Spinoza's logic as not primarily formal and sees Spinoza as thus rejecting a form/content distinction in the case of logic. Why, then, should Garrett see Spinoza as accepting such a form/content distinction in the realm of the PSR itself? Indeed, one might say that the PSR militates precisely against such a distinction (just as it militates, as I would say, against distinctions in general), for such a distinction would be unintelligible.

Again, this is not the occasion to resolve this matter. Instead, I would like to close by celebrating the fact that the very existence of this debate about Spinoza has been made possible by Garrett's long-running, rigorous, extremely influential, and continuing work on Spinoza and also by celebrating the appearance of this volume. Garrett has taught so many students of Spinoza so much, and we all owe him a unique debt. As the Beatles might say, with a teacher like that, you know you should be glad.


I am grateful to Stephen Harrop for helpful comments on an earlier draft of this review.

[1] Ethics, 1def3. All references to Spinoza will be to his Ethics. I use a standard system for referring to passages from the Ethics. I will employ, as Garrett most often does, Curley's translation from The Collected Works of Spinoza, vol. I, edited and translated by Edwin Curley, Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1985.

[2] Edwin Curley and Greg Walski, "Spinoza's Necessitarianism Reconsidered" in New Essays on the Rationalists, edited by Rocco Gennaro and Charles Huenemann (New York: Oxford University Press, 1999): 241-62.

[3] See, e.g., Carriero, "Spinoza on Final Causality" in Garber and Nadler (eds.), Oxford Studies in Early Modern Philosophy, volume 2, pp. 105-47; and Hoffman, "Does Efficient Causation Presuppose Final Causation? Aquinas vs. Early Modern Rationalism" in Newlands and Jorgensen (eds.), Metaphysics and the Good (Oxford: Oxford University Press), pp. 295-312, see especially pp. 310-11.

[4] E.g., in "Steps toward Eleaticism in Spinoza's Philosophy of Action" in Naaman-Zauderer (ed.), Freedom, Action, and Motivation in Spinoza's Ethics (New York: Routledge, 2020), pp. 15-36, see especially pp. 21-22.

[5] For example, in "Spinoza's Substance Monism", in Koistinen and Biro (eds.), Spinoza: Metaphysical Themes (New York: Oxford University Press), pp. 11-37, see especially pp. 22-33.