Nature: Course Notes from the College de France

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Merleau-Ponty, Maurice, Nature: Course Notes from the College de France, D. Seglard, ed. R Vallier, trans. Northwestern, 2003, 313pp, $25.95 (pbk), ISBN 0810114461

Reviewed by Taylor Carman, Barnard College, Columbia University


Once upon a time, everything in the world, indeed the world itself, seemed to have a kind of purpose. Human beings could feel at home there, if only somewhat uneasily, inasmuch as their own purposes, however different in content, were more or less of a piece formally with those of nature and God. Then modern science came along and, under the encouragement of increasingly sophisticated mechanical technologies, reconceptualized nature on analogy with the machine, analyzed wholes into parts, replaced final causes with efficient causes, and seemed to discredit all teleological explanations of natural phenomena. The result, most profoundly expressed in Cartesian dualism, excluded the mind and God from nature and in effect split us down the middle, radically reconstruing us as composites of soul and body, leaving no separate ontological category for living things distinct from ghosts on the one side and machines on the other.

Philosophy, perhaps Western culture as a whole, has been straining under the conceptual burden ever since. We would like to understand ourselves as the animals we know we are, yet the categories of our theoretical understanding seem to leave no room for such a notion. The physical sciences, or at any rate their ideological spokesmen, continue to press for reductive mechanistic explanations, while our own manifestly purposive and intelligent attitudes exhibit intentionality and a rational order seemingly incommensurable with the efficient causes and effects of the physical world. Where then does our embodied experience and agency fit in the grand scheme of things, between brute nature and pure spirit?

The foregoing narrative is a caricature, of course, but it conveys something of the broad ontological perspective from which Merleau-Ponty delivered these three lecture courses at the Collège de France (in 1956–57, 1957–58, and 1959–60), each entitled “The Concept of Nature.” Strictly speaking, as the translator puts it in his introduction, “we cannot say that this is a text ’by’ Merleau-Ponty” (xv). What it contains are instead transcriptions of “mediocre copies” of “fragmentary” typewritten notes (xiii), most written by an unknown auditor, some penned by Merleau-Ponty himself. The result is mixed: occasionally repetitive, sometimes undecipherable, and regrettably marred by an often infelicitous, at times unreliable, translation. Just to cite a few random examples of editorial error, several lines of text have disappeared from page 271, and from note 18 on page 291, and in both the translator’s introduction (xix) and the main body of the text (199), the Greek terms “logos” and “phusis” are written with terminal zetas instead of sigmas, resulting in gibberish.

And yet, in the end, the volume offers a genuine glimpse into the remarkable vision Merleau-Ponty was groping toward in the last few years of his life, a vision partly articulated in his final, unfinished work, The Visible and the Invisible. These late lectures contain far too much complex and suggestive material even to summarize in this short space, so I will be selective and concentrate instead on what I take to be some of the more crucial highlights.

One point that emerges clearly in each of Merleau-Ponty’s lectures entitled “The Concept of Nature” is that the singular is misleading: there is neither in these notes nor in fact one single concept of nature. As Merleau-Ponty says, “Nature is not a numerically distinct theme” (204). The teleological nature of Aristotle and the Stoics is not the “pure object” of the Epicurean and Cartesians traditions, which is neither the “humanist” conception one finds in Kant nor the Romantic conception obscurely intimated by Schelling. Merleau-Ponty’s discussion of these historical figures in the 1956–57 course proceeds to Bergson and Husserl, then on to more recent developments in modern science, including quantum mechanics, and concludes with a discussion of Whitehead.

The second set of lectures, in 1957–58, deals with “Animality, the Human Body, and the Passage to Culture” and includes extended discussions of the highly suggestive, but now mostly forgotten, work of the psychologist and physician Arnold Gesell and the biologists G. E. Coghill and Jakob von Uexküll. Like Kurt Goldstein and the Gestalt psychologists who influenced Merleau-Ponty’s early works, The Structure of Behavior (1942) and Phenomenology of Perception (1945), these figures defend holistic conceptions of organic form against reductive mechanistic models of biological function. The parallel is instructive, for just as cognitive science has seemed to some to render obsolete the psychological theories that inspired Merleau-Ponty’s early phenomenology, so too, after his death, the reductive agenda of molecular biology eventually eclipsed the holistic literature he was drawing on in these later lectures. But an eclipse is not a refutation, and there is still arguably something philosophically interesting and important in the interplay between organic form and function, which have after all not been entirely reduced to physical or even chemical mechanisms.

Gesell insists on the unity of body and behavior. The two cannot be disentangled, since behavior is part and parcel of the body’s organization, while the body is the concrete manifestation of its behaviors. The body is not a passive medium that also happens to move in the way a machine can either function or not function and still remain the object it is. For human beings, moving and being at rest, like waking and sleeping, are equally dynamic states that preserve the body’s morphological structure. Even embryological development is not an entirely “blind” process, but is constantly conditioned by optimizing tendencies and states of relative equilibrium, which imbue all future growth with a distinctive “style” or “bearing” (149). For Gesell, “the enigma of form is omnipresent,” indeed it constitutes “the fundamental enigma of science” (150). The organism is thus a kind of balance of spontaneity and constraint. So too, strictly conditioned impulses and spontaneous improvisations are always intertwined, so that the distinction between nature and nurture proves to be a false dichotomy. It is impossible to read references to Gesell’s “principle of reciprocal intertwining,” “weaving,” and “meeting of threads” (149) without concluding that his work must be among the principal sources of a dominant theme in Merleau-Ponty’s later texts, in particular The Visible and the Invisible, namely the “intertwining” or “chiasm” that ties the “flesh” of living things to that of the world they inhabit.

Coghill likewise emphasizes the role of global behavior and organic form over discrete development and isolated neural function. Tadpoles that grow into salamanders already move in characteristic ways – curling and uncurling, buckling, bending in an S, zigzagging, and finally swimming – prior to and contemporary with the eventual formation of the nervous system that might otherwise seem to dictate all activity in a purely mechanical, “bottom-up” fashion. Here maturation and behavior are one, early developmental processes seeming to anticipate behaviors only manifest at a later stage. How is this possible? Merleau-Ponty at times makes this aspect of ontogeny sound more mysterious than it really is, since, after all, organisms inherit global dispositions from a past history of selection. What might look like magical anticipations of future developments are, of course, complex inherited characteristics. But Merleau-Ponty also makes it clear that he does not intend such holistic observations to breathe new life into old notions of vital forces or external final causes. The point is instead that, contrary to prevailing opinion, mechanism and finalism present us with a false choice; rejecting the one does not require embracing the other.

What is at stake for Merleau-Ponty is rather, as he says, understanding phenomena by grasping their global aspects, over and beyond their discrete parts. To see the embryological development of a salamander as a kind of anticipation of its mature form is not to posit an entelechy, but to see the organism as a whole pattern of growth and behavior stretched out over time: “We thus do not mean that the future is thought in the present, but only that the plurality of phenomena binds together and constitutes an ensemble that has a meaning.” Gestalt theory pointed up the irreducible forms manifest in perceptual experience, and neither is there any reason for biology to banish them in its study of living creatures: “Psychology does easily what science finds difficult to do, namely, allow for an organizing principle within totality. … In the phenomenal milieu, nothing impedes the whole from being other than the sum of its parts without being for all that a transcendent entity” (153). Again, this is no mere isolated technical problem in comparative anatomy, but a basic ontological problem: “What status must we give totality? Such is the philosophical question that Coghill’s experiments pose, a question which is at the center of this course on the idea of nature and maybe the whole of philosophy” (145).

Merleau-Ponty then discusses the ideas of the Estonian biologist, Jakob von Uexküll, who also incidentally figures prominently in Heidegger’s lectures of 1929–30, The Fundamental Concepts of Metaphysics. Like Heidegger, Uexküll gets a lot of mileage out of the combinatory possibilities afforded by the word “world” (Welt). The “environment” (Umwelt) is that chunk of the physical world individuated by the behavior of an organism; it is thus something intermediate between the objective surroundings and whatever might appear to the organism subjectively. But not all organisms have environments. Worms, urchins, and starfish, for example, are mere “animal-machines,” whose behaviors are not sufficiently unified to carve out a milieu within which they can encounter things around them. Somewhat paradoxically, Uexküll argues that a “lower animal” like an amoeba, precisely because it lacks defined organs and a nervous system, exhibits more unity and is thus in a sense “much less a machine than the horse” (170). Nevertheless, protozoa have a entirely “closed” relation to their environments, since they respond only to what relates directly to their own vital functions. Only “higher animals” are able to construct a “counter-world” (Gegenwelt), a world over against themselves, by reflecting it in the “world-mirror” (Weltspiegel) of their nervous systems. They thereby internalize their environments in the form of a Merkwelt of perceptions and a Wirkwelt of motor habits. The environments of various animals can overlap and interpenetrate, or one can encompass others, and indeed Uexküll conceives of nature as a whole, or “absolute reality,” as the environment of all environments correlative with an overarching “nature-subject” (Natursubjekt). Merleau-Ponty judiciously observes that these ideas “are not what is most interesting in the work of Uexküll” (177). Rather, the notion of an internal relation between organisms and their primitively meaningful environments seems to offer a way out of the vicious dilemma between mechanism and spirit.

The final set of notes, for the lectures of 1959–60, subtitled “Nature and Logos: The Human Body,” were written by Merleau-Ponty himself, for his own use, and are consequently, like the working notes in The Visible and the Invisible, often fragmentary, cryptic, sometimes unintelligible. At their outset, though, they contain the best hints of the overall nature of his project, in particular his Heideggerian conception of ontology as an account of the intelligibility of entities qua entities. What Heidegger calls the “ontological difference” between “being” (Sein) and “entities” (Seiende) rarely emerges clearly in Merleau-Ponty’s work. One strains, for instance, to discern a difference in his vocabulary between “Being” (Être) and “being” (être). Unlike Heidegger, who draws a sharp distinction between entities and the sense they make, or the sense we make of them, Merleau-Ponty sometimes seems to rummage among the entities themselves, trying to identify the intrinsic properties that make them what they are. His project, that is, can appear to be the kind of constructive metaphysics that Heidegger initially deferred in his early works as a philosophical enterprise for which his own project of fundamental ontology was merely preparatory, and which he later abandoned altogether as a closed chapter in the history of Western thought.

It is refreshing, then, to hear Merleau-Ponty carefully distinguish his own effort both from “a theory of knowledge of Nature” (203) and from “a super-science, a secret science … a science that would discover a reality beneath the appearances” (204). Instead, his concern is with what he regards as the “unique theme of philosophy: the nexus, the vinculum ’Nature’ / ’Man’ / ’God’ “ (204) – which is to say, the totality within which we find ourselves, one entity among others. Our embodiment is not just a contingent fact accompanying our consciousness, nor is a living body the dumb mechanism Cartesian science would have us believe: “human being is not animality (in the sense of mechanism) + reason. – And this is why we are concerned with the body: before being reason, humanity is another corporeity” (208). What is astonishing is that we are not just embedded blindly in the thickness of things, like objects, but open onto a spacious, illuminated world. For Merleau-Ponty, as for Heidegger, that is, our encounter with entities rests on a more primitive grasp of the milieu in which things manifest themselves in our world. In short, “the concept of Nature is always the expression of an ontology – and its privileged expression” (204).

The inquiry into the concept of nature in these lectures, then, is neither epistemology nor metaphysics, but a situated interpretation of natural phenomena from our own natural point of view: “What we are looking for … is a true explicitation of Being … the unveiling of Being as that which they [entities] exemplify, that which places them together on the side of what is not nothing. … [an] explicitation of what being-natural or being naturally means” (206, translation modified, emphasis added). The point is not to build theories or analyze concepts, but to interpret nature from our own natural perspective within it, for any understanding of nature available to us will perforce be conditioned by our own nature, and by our place in nature:

the Nature within us must have some relation to Nature outside us, indeed Nature outside us must be revealed to us by the Nature that we are. … By the nature in us, we can know Nature, and reciprocally it is from ourselves that living beings and even space speak to us … It is no longer a matter or constructing arguments, but of seeing how all this hangs together. (206, translation modified)

Such remarks are reminiscent not only of the obscure aspirations of the Presocratics to comprehend the nature of everything, but also of Wilfrid Sellars’s more homely definition of philosophy as the attempt “to understand how things in the broadest possible sense of the term hang together in the broadest possible sense of the term.” For Merleau-Ponty, the problem of nature is neither an empirical nor a conceptual problem, but part of a larger question concerning how things as a whole “hang together.” It is what originally inspired his interest in Gestalt psychology and phenomenology, and it is what drives his efforts here to conceive of human beings as natural creatures whose selves and worlds are, as if miraculously, imbued with meaning to an incomparable degree.