Nature, History, State: 1933-1934

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Martin Heidegger, Nature, History, State: 1933-1934, Gregory Fried and Richard Polt (trs., eds.), Bloomsbury, 2013, 203pp., $80.00 (hbk), ISBN: 9781441176387.

Reviewed by Charles Bambach, University of Texas at Dallas


Thanks to the publication and blitzkrieg reception of the Black Notebooks, the work of Heidegger is now once again the focus of a raging public controversy. In newspapers, blogs, magazines, television interviews, and public forums, the question of Heidegger's ties to National Socialism and its vicious anti-Semitic credo has again become a de rigueur topic of discussion. The fallout from this so-called "crisis" has rendered Heidegger's works ever more suspect and questionable. Even the renowned president of the Martin HeideggerGesellschaft, Günter Figal, has acknowledged that "the anti-Semitic comments in the Black Notebooks are disgusting and appalling. They have saddened me."[1] In the wake of all this controversy, so many of Heidegger's manuscripts -- especially from the period 1933-1945 -- are now being vetted for their "political" implications and racist views. It is within this new context of reception (although for seasoned readers of Heidegger this registers as merely another episode of the crisis-fatigue that has been ongoing for the past quarter century) that another Heidegger manuscript, Nature, History, State from Winter Semester 1933-1934, comes into English translation. Against this background, I think it is fair to ask: how significant is this work? More particularly, does it offer any new insights into Heidegger's political thinking or his ties to National Socialism and his reflections on Jews and their role within Germany and the modern world? Finally, apart from these all too current themes about lurid political scandal, are there any other philosophically relevant contributions in this new publication? Before addressing these questions, let us consider the nature of the manuscript itself.

The complete text of Nature, History, State comprises about 50 pages, but in no sense is this manuscript "complete." It consists, rather, of ten student protocols covering ten seminar sessions from November 3, 1933 to February 23, 1934, the period when Heidegger was serving as the National Socialist rector at the University of Freiburg. In other words, this text was not written by Heidegger himself, but constitutes a compilation of notes/summaries from ten different student authors. Although Heidegger did later review these protocols and make two interpolations, the hermeneutic integrity of this text is open to question. Hence, the two editors of the collection, Gregory Fried and Richard Polt, claim that "while we cannot rely on this text as a verbatim transcript of what Heidegger said, it is reasonable to take it as good evidence of the essential content of the views he developed during this seminar" (2). I would concur with this assessment, while also reminding readers that texts of this sort should be viewed as supplemental rather than primary. That is, such texts helps us to situate Heidegger's political commitments in terms of the specific philosophical issues that preoccupy him at this time. This fine collection does precisely that: it provides both an excellent translation of the seminar protocols themselves, as well as insightful scholarly essays that read them in and against Heidegger's other works from after Being and Time(1927) through the delivery of the "Introduction to Metaphysics" lectures of 1935.

In their helpful "Introduction," Fried and Polt acknowledge that "the seminar in this volume is an essential piece of evidence for those who wish to assess the degree to which he [Heidegger] was intellectually committed to Nazi ideology" (1). Here the juridical metaphor is telling, since so much of the previous discussion of Heidegger's Nazism has been conducted as if it were a kind of legal prosecution. Yet to their credit, Fried and Polt offer a thoughtful, balanced, and penetrating assessment, one that is characterized by a rigorous professionalism in their work as translators and as editors. Here they have gathered together four distinguished Heidegger scholars whose uniformly excellent essays approach the seminar from four different, yet complementary, perspectives. To this they add a chapter by the philosopher Slavoj Žižek that diverges from the other essays by situating the seminar in a debate about the historical struggle between Nazism and communism. In putting together such a collection, Fried and Polt come to terms with some difficult and disturbing themes in Heidegger's work that reinforce their conviction that there can be no doubt about Heidegger's fundamental commitment to the National Socialist movement, nor to his "postwar attempts to minimize the extent of his support for Nazism" (1). Here, they show themselves as deeply critical of Heidegger's stance, yet not willing to embrace the extreme condemnation of Heidegger carried out by Emmanuel Faye in his controversial study Heidegger: The Introduction of Nazism into Philosophy. In this book Faye identifies theNature, History, State seminar as "the main text [for] . . . the total identification of Heidegger's teaching with the principle of Hitlerism itself," so much so that he can claim: "In the work of Martin Heidegger, the very principles of philosophy are abolished."[2] Fried, Polt, and their co-contributors, on the other hand, acknowledge "the errors in Heidegger's view," while condemning in a strongly critical way what is "pernicious" about this, without dismissing Heidegger's whole corpus or, like Faye, advocating the total banishment of Heidegger's works from university libraries everywhere.

We can find a model for this kind of approach in "Volk and Führer," by the German philosopher, Marion Heinz. Heinz shows in convincing fashion that the seminar functions as both the philosophical and propagandistic validation of "the Führer state, the ideology of blood and soil, and other core elements of the Nazi worldview" (68). By reading the seminar through key Heidegger concepts in Being and Time -- authentic temporality, historicity, resoluteness, decision, destiny, care -- she demonstrates how Heidegger's political language of 1933-34 emerges from the temporal concept of Dasein as a political being placed in a situation of deciding for a particular kind of community. She also stresses the educative function of the seminar as a way for Heidegger to prepare the Volk for entry into the state by "the creation of a new fundamental attitude of the will" (63). Peter Gordon's essay also draws important connections between the WS 1933-34 seminar and Being and Time, showing quite powerfully how Heidegger grants "the political" an ontologicalstatus that lends an aura of profundity to something that needs to be read as a mere "ideological preference" (93). Gordon reminds us that when reading Heidegger's political works as "philosophy" we would do well to remember their ideological function, especially when they bring in the blatant prejudice of Nazi propaganda about rooted, autochthonous Germans who belong to the state and "Semitic nomads" to whom, the seminar notes claim, "the nature of our German space . . . will perhaps never be revealed at all" (56).

This issue of belonging to the Volk and to "our German space" is taken up in exemplary fashion by both Theodore Kisiel and Robert Bernasconi, who do an excellent job of placing the seminar within the Nazi debates about Volk-race-state-university education and within Heidegger's own work of the 1930s. Bernasconi especially demonstrates how Heidegger's most essential claims in the seminar -- "the highest actualization of human being happens in the state" (64), "the state is the preeminent being of the people (Volk)" (57), "The Führer state . . . [is] the actualization of the people in the leader" (64) -- belong to the contemporary debates in Germany among other committed thinkers/ideologues who are engaged in a battle about the "proper" form of National Socialism. Heidegger renounced most of the NS babble about the Volk, even as he adapted some of its contemporary lingo (e.g., "mandate," "mission," "service," "sacrifice," "will," "struggle," "labor," et al.) in an effort to change and direct its meaning in new ways to fit his philosophy. The great irony here, however, is that Heidegger's "break" with the party and the Führer occurs as a reaction to the party's rejection of his thought and less in Heidegger's bold or courageous rejection of its tenets. It was Heidegger's inability to shift the direction of the party away from the crude practices of Volkskunde, Rassenkunde, politische Wissenschaft, and the AmtRosenberg's biological racism that led him to withdraw his enthusiastic public support for Nazism. Instead he retreated ever more deeply into a private form of his own Hölderlinianbrand of National Socialism, which emerged after his resignation as rector.

As Bernasconi reminds us, it is Heidegger's "hubris" and "lack of understanding" that led him to imagine he could attain the mantle of philosophical leadership for the Nazi movement. In other words, Heidegger's later break with National Socialism was less the result of a courageous resoluteness than the human, all too human sense of disappointment at not being appreciated for his philosophical genius. It is within this context that, in his first semester after the failure of the rectorate, we need to understand his citation ofHölderlin's letter to Böhlendorff in 1804 that "they [the Germans] have no use for me."[3] But it is also his "petty jealousy" (123) at the success of other Nazi ideologues that leaves us with an even more chilling prospect: what if Heidegger had succeeded in his quest to guide the Nazi revolution? What direction might his thought have taken? As it was, Heidegger's own definition of the German Volk -- who belonged and who did not -- was marked by a "sinister logic" (125) of exclusion and demarcation spawned by an "anxiety" (124) about the alien elements within the Volk and those natives without who remained exiled by the calculative metaphysics of political space drawn up by the architects of the Versailles settlement. In this sense, Bernasconi maintains, Heidegger "succumbed to a logic every bit as dangerous" as those hard-core Nazi propagandists who sought to nullify his philosophical vision of the German Reich (125).

Kisiel's judgments about Heidegger are less harshly drawn, for he tries to situate Heidegger's hoped-for NS revolution against the tradition of the German mandarins' pedagogical reform embodied by Johann Pestalozzi and Paul Natorp. Kisiel sees the Nazi revolution of 1933-1934 as opening a moment of crisis for Germany, one that Heidegger identifies as akairos moment of authentic identity and self-definition. Who "are" we?, Heidegger asks. For a generation that experienced the somber defeat of the Great War and the ensuing treaty burdens, unemployment, and economic collapse of the 1920s, the time appears ripe for a radical re-definition of the relationship between Volk and state. We stand before a decision concerning our proper mission and mandate, Heidegger declares, and only if we as a Volk expose ourselves (Ausgesetztheitto the danger of our historical task can we create the essential possibility of our destiny. Kisiel's accomplishment here is to show how Heidegger's whole political commitment is to philosophically educating the German people and "instilling a deep understanding and clear knowledge of the original and essential connection between the people and its state" (138). Such education "exposes Dasein to a situation of extreme questioning which dictates that it struggle mightily and even violently with the overwhelming power of being" (139). Nonetheless, Kisiel maintains that Heidegger's commitment to "Bodenständigkeit has little to do with Nazi Bodenständigkeit and a lot to do with getting at the roots of our native, indigenous, experiential languagephenomenologically" (149). Yes, I would argue, Heidegger's understanding of rootedness does connect to language, dwelling, and "getting back to the matters themselves" (149). Yet it can hardly be denied that his excurses into the political dimension of Bodenständigkeit are deeply embedded in the racial metaphysics of National Socialism itself.

The last essay, by Žižek, is quite different from the other four, in that it attempts to find something viable in Heidegger's seminar that is not weighted down by Nazi doctrines and commitments. Žižek finds this in what he calls an "essential possibility" of communism that Heidegger himself ignored, but that Žižek seeks to unearth in the positive understanding of a "collective will", which he applied to the historical problem of class struggle. As provocative as this argument is, it ultimately tells us a good deal more about Žižek's own politics of engagement than it does about Heidegger's philosophy of the Volk, the Führer state, and the vision of a resolute and committed National Socialist future.

Taken together, this translation and collection of essays serves to help us work through the details of Heidegger's undeniable commitments to, and enthusiasm for, the Nazi revolution of 1933 -- and it does so by showing that these commitments were fundamentally rooted in Heidegger's own philosophical language and way of thinking, and did not serve as a mere ideological veneer. Moreover, this publication offers some new insight into Heidegger's views about the relationship between Volk and state that were sketched out in the political speeches and hinted at in some of the lecture courses, but which here take center stage. As regards his commentary about "Semitic nomads," this merely serves as another deplorable example of a systematic kind of anti-Jewish thinking that we have already seen in his correspondence and notebooks.[4] What we are left with is quite simply another part of the puzzle regarding Heidegger's political views, views which I am convinced are not merely passing reactions to a historical happening, but comprise an important part of Heidegger's ongoing critique of modernity and its rootlessness. Here we see that Heidegger pinned his hopes for the coming revolution on the radicality of the Führer state to bring about a new kind of Dasein -- one resolute and committed to a new inception of German destiny that would be guided by a renewed kind of philosophical thinking. But what emerges from these reflections is, sadly, a thinking bound by its own time and unable to twist itself free from its devastating political calculus.

At the basis of Heidegger's embracing of National Socialism was his belief that its political energy might provide the needed hope for a more profound, originary leap (Sprung) out of the quotidian: an ontological revolution spurred on by a renewed commitment to primordial Greek thinking. In this context, we need to remember that the seminar of WS 1933-34 attempts to root the NS revolution in an "understanding of Greek Being" (27) that will initiate a profound break with the everyday world of Gerede and the time-bound-concerns of das Man. In the Introduction to Metaphysics (1935) Heidegger emphasizes this point by insisting that "all essential questioning in philosophy necessarily remains untimely."[5] And yet here in Nature, History, State we see in the clearest manner possible how painfully "timely" Heidegger's work could sometimes be. The question that remains for us is whether we join critics like Faye in finding this work wholly "unphilosophical" or whether we recognize it indeed as philosophy, but as philosophy that offers what MauriceBlanchot terms "a wound to thinking itself."[6] It is precisely in our Verwindung or recovery from such a wound that, I believe, the conversation needs to begin.

[1] Interview with Günter Figal from Italian news journal, La Stampa, March 18, 2014. 

[2] Emmanuel Faye, Heidegger: The Introduction of Nazism into Philosophy, trans. Michael B. Smith (New Haven: Yale University Press, 2009), 113, 316.

[3] Martin Heidegger, Hölderlin's Hymnen 'Germanien' und 'Der Rhein', Gesamtausgabe 39 (Frankfurt: Klostermann, 1980), 136.

[4] See for example the anti-Jewish references in the letters to his wife, Elfride: "Mein liebes Seelchen!": Briefe Martin Heideggers an seine Frau Elfride, 1915-1970 (Munich: Deutsche Verlags-Anstalt, 2005), 51, 112, 116, 137, 176, 180, 184 and Martin Heidegger/Kurt Bauch, Briefwechsel, 1932-1975 (Freiburg: Alber, 2010), 18. For some of the references in the Black Notebooks, Martin Heidegger, Überlegungen VII-XI (Schwarze Hefte 1938/39), Gesamtausgabe 95 (Frankfurt: Klostermann, 2014), 97; ÜberlegungenXII-XV (Schwarze Hefte 1939-1941), Gesamtausgabe 96 (Frankfurt: Klostermann, 2014), 46, 56, 243, 262.

[5] Martin Heidegger, Introduction to Metaphysics (New Haven: Yale University Press, 1999); Einführung in die Metaphysik, Gesamtausgabe 40 (Frankfurt: Klostermann, 1980), 10.

[6] Maurice Blanchot, Political Writings, 1953-1993, trans. by Zakir Paul (New York: Fordham University Press, 2010), 145.