Nature, Human Nature, and Human Difference: Race in Early Modern Philosophy

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Justin E. H. Smith, Nature, Human Nature, and Human Difference: Race in Early Modern Philosophy, Princeton University Press, 2015, 296pp., $39.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780691153643.

Reviewed by Lauren Guilmette, Florida Atlantic University


Justin E. H. Smith bridges an unexpected intersection that may be of interest to two 'kinds' of readers: primarily, to scholars of early modern philosophy, offering a unique interpretation of Leibniz and his theory of "unity-in-diversity" in the context of early modern global conquest; second, to critical philosophers of race, with whom Smith attempts to place himself in conversation. Filling a gap he perceives in the historical ontology of 'race', Smith engages the conditions that make it "possible to say some things, and not others, about human nature and human difference" in Western modernity (7). Placing violent dehumanization, exploitation, and their rationalization in a complex interplay with the desire to classify, Smith's contention is that regard for 'the human' as part of 'nature' -- subject to the same laws -- led to the taxonomizing of human types as 'natural kinds': an "ethno-prospecting" than accompanied the "bio-prospecting" of colonial exploration (11-12). Smith engages this early modern history to show the contingent emergence of taxonomizing tendencies and Eurocentric frames structuring "philosophy" itself.[1]

In a 2013 New York Times opinion piece,[2] Smith summarizes what I take to be the central question animating his new monograph: "Why have we chosen to go with Hume and Kant," who proselytized hierarchies based on the arbitrariness of complexion, "rather than with the pre-racial conception" predicated on the universalism of human nature, or with "the anti-racial picture" offered by Herder in response?[3] As long as we speak as though 'race' captured something real about human diversity, Smith contends, we allow an "ad hoc rationalization of slavery" to define our terms. Drawing a comparison to the 'witch' as a former 'social kind' of early modernity, and 'phlogiston' as a former 'natural kind,' Smith asks: if these categories could be dismissed as having no referent, why not the same for 'race'? After summarizing what I take to be the major moves of the monograph, I appreciate Smith's turn to historical ontology but raise concerns about his intervention into Africana philosophy and philosophy of race.

Smith begins and culminates his monograph with the example of Anton Wilhelm Amo, a West African former "chamber-moor" who came to some prominence as a philosopher and legal theorist in the 1730s, defending a philosophy dissertation on Leibniz at the University of Halle in 1734 (210-1). At the time, his intellectual superiors and peers took no issue with his complexion; in fact, the rector of the University of Wittenberg appended a dedicatory letter to his dissertation praising "the natural genius" of Africa and contextualizing Amo in a lineage of North African authors such as Augustine (212). During Amo's time in Germany, attitudes and biases changed considerably. First, Amo's owner since the age of three, Duke Anthony Ulrich, had educated him primarily to impress the Russian tsar, Peter the Great, who had legally adopted and raised an African son; yet, the duke lost interest in Russia as his political interests shifted, and when he died in 1731, he left Amo without money or support (213). Amo barely managed to survive as a tutor in Jena and Wittenberg, and in 1747, after he was mocked in a popular poem for falling in love with a white woman, he returned to his home country in disgrace, dying in anonymity (2). The text centers on the shift in German academic culture demonstrated by this rise and fall; as Smith writes: "within a few decades after Amo's flight from Germany at the end of the 1740s, the racist view of the natural inferiority of blacks would be predominant, whereas it had not been when Amo began his study in the 1720s" (228). Smith notes the shift in European terminology for an African from "Moor" to "Negro" around 1750 translated the quasi-racial distinction of a Roman province into a figure explained (and dismissed) by the realism of racial categories (ibid).

For Smith, it is no small detail that Amo was a reader of Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz (1646-1716), and he disputes the narrative in which Leibniz figures as a keystone in the development of racial hierarchies; he thus challenges the narrative that attributes 'race' to the "natural philosopher" François Bernier -- considered by some to be the first to invoke 'race' for the purpose of grouping people by skin color, and whom Leibniz read (156). In turn, Blumenbach, who wrote On the Natural Varieties of Mankind (1775), read Leibniz's summary notes of Bernier as affirmations, failing to see Leibniz's disagreement with Bernier and taking him to be a founding thinker of racial science (156). Against Bernier and Blumenbach, who endorsed racial types, Leibniz maintained the universality of 'human nature' -- i.e. the rational soul -- as distinct from taxonomies of difference in 'nature.'

Leibniz's theory of monads -- individual entities that represent within themselves "the entire order of coexistence" -- can help to clarify his own questionable statements on race (162). For instance, when Leibniz writes of seizing an island near the African coast for training "warrior slaves," Smith explains that this domination is based not on any essential difference but by a relative capacity to perceive divine (Christian) law.[4] As Smith emphasizes, Leibniz claimed that all humans, by their 'human nature,' are equal insofar as they possess rational souls, setting aside the contingencies of anatomical and/or cultural distinctions (168).

Smith argues that dualism provided the conditions for universal equality insofar as it distinguished the soul from the colors and varieties of embodiment. Though Smith mentions Baruch Spinoza (1632-1677) only with reference to his use of the term 'black' in a 1664 letter, his monist metaphysics provides a compelling counterpoint to Smith's claims about 'human nature' and 'nature' in Leibniz. Smith starkly disagrees -- though he does not engage their work -- with feminist and 'post-humanist' philosophers who have drawn from Spinoza to claim that viewing the human as separate from nature has long framed the desire to dominate those deemed closer to it.[5] This seems, to this reader at least, an interesting point for debate.

The central point with which I take issue, however, comes up in the first chapter, when Smith claims that philosophers of race have criticized implicit biases but have not yet changed them, i.e. not yet moved beyond critique to offer "positive prescriptions for correcting the false beliefs we evidently harbor unknowingly," and he further suggests that he has staked the way forward by moving beyond "conceptual analysis" to "the archives" (267). While I appreciate Smith's attention to detail in the interplay of travel narratives, taxonomic works, and philosophical theories, this claim about "philosophers of race" at-large oversteps the constraints of his research, particularly given that his primary interlocutors in the field seem to be Anthony Appiah and Naomi Zack, whose writings are well-respected but not therefore representative of plural conversations. Additionally, Smith's historical narrative of 'human nature' overlooks past gradations of racial 'sub-persons' and the experiences of cognitive dissonance generated by these gradations. Thus, Charles Mills writes that, beyond an inanimate object or a non-human animal, the 'sub-person' presents something more complex:

Rather, the peculiar status of a sub-person is that it is an entity which, because of phenotype, seems (from, of course, the perspective of the categorizer) human in some respects but not in others . . . And the tensions and internal contradictions in this concept capture, I would argue, the tensions and internal contradictions of the black experience in a white-supremacist society.[6]

The humanizing category of 'personhood,' Mills notes, has long been differentially distributed, shaping the African-American experience of "juridical standing, moral status, personal/racial identity, epistemic reliability, existential plight, political inclusion, social metaphysics, sexual relations, aesthetic worth" (ibid). 'Race,' then, marks the paradoxical lived experience of being seen and not-seen, pigeonholed and explained away; far from a biological category, 'race' points to shared histories of oppression and resistance into which one finds oneself thrown.

Setting aside Smith's narrowing of 'philosophy of race' and meeting him on the terms of his argument, recall that Smith responds to Appiah and Zack, who deem 'race' a bad biological fiction as they also find utility in the term; he claims that, beyond dismissing 'race' as a social construct, we need a different term entirely.[7] Indeed, race is a bad "biological fiction." Where Smith places the emphasis on the biological falsehood of race, I am interested in the status of race as a fiction, which is more complex than a falsehood insofar as it shapes lived experience, binding communities and institutionalizing 'outsiders' through pedagogical webs of images, half-remembered stories, desires and aversions, anecdotes, etc. In his unfinished Treatise on the Emendation of the Intellect, Spinoza distinguished fictions from falsehoods; to fiction signifies not just to feign or fabricate but to shape, fashion or form, arrange or put in order, represent, imagine.[8] Fictions arise in situations where we have partial knowledge of an object as 'existing' but do not comprehend its 'essence,' as with our explanations for historical and social phenomena (TIE 17-18). Unlike following an angry mob or passively assenting to lies propagated by others, Spinoza declared that we need not be "apprehensive about engaging in fiction" provided we could at any time subject the fiction to questions of how and why it came to be (i.e. remembering the scope of its meaning and power). Smith is right, then, that the figure of the 'witch' is a fiction, but cultural fantasies are hard to kill; thus, the ghost of the witch glimmers whenever a woman does something culturally strange, unintelligible, or sometimes just unexpected, or whenever that culture needs a guilty subject to punish for some otherwise-inexplicable event. Indeed, 'race' is a bad 'fiction,' but that does not mean we can exorcize it from speech and thereby do away with its power; in his hope of bypassing racial fictions, Smith minimizes the disciplinary reinforcement, habituation, and affective pull of those fictions.

[1] In other branches of his research trajectory, Smith asks after the place of the human-animal divide in drawing the boundaries of political community and engages in a comparative "global" history of philosophy before 1750, which shifts our canon-based conception of philosophical notions like 'abstraction' and 'dialectic' (Justin E. H. Smith, "My Research: The Next Ten Years.""

[2] Justin E.H. Smith, "The Enlightenment's 'Race' Problem, and Ours," New York Times (The Stone), 2/10/2013.

[3] Herder, Smith explains, inherited and extended the Leibnizian vision of unity-in-diversity, unifying the human species as successive generations in a similarly egalitarian chain; in this sense, he was "virtually alone among his contemporaries in recognizing the fundamental provincialism of racial taxonomies" (248).

[4] Domination cannot be based on the right of the powerful and, contra Hobbes, "equality" under the sovereign is not enough. Leibniz claims we also need "piety" to ensure that civic law follows divine law (177). Thus, according to Leibniz, domination can be justified when, given the circumstances of the parties in question, "it serves to edify or cultivate the abilities and moral well-being of the dominated" (181).

[5] Moira Gatens and Genevieve Lloyd, Collective Imaginings: Spinoza, Past and Present (Routledge, 1999); Hasana Sharp, Spinoza and the Politics of Renaturalization (Chicago UP, 2011). Sharp adds "re" to her project of naturalization out of respect for feminist and other strains of neo-Hegelian critical theory, though her turn to Spinoza works to displace a 'personal politics' for the impersonal terms of affective forces. The desire for recognition depends on elevating the human over nature as free and rational, traits that serve to indicate "who is human (fetuses? babies? women? slaves? the cognitively disabled?), and thereby demarcate our sphere of moral concern" (172).

[6] Charles W. Mills, "Non-Cartesian Sums: Philosophy and the African-American Experience," pp. 223-243, Teaching Philosophy 17:3 (September 1994), 228.

[7] In Chapter One, as an alternative to 'race,' Smith suggests 'ethnie,' which denotes the same differences without implying the biological essentialism of 'race' (42, 45).

[8] Baruch Spinoza, "Treatise on the Emendation of the Intellect" (TIE), Complete Works, trans Shirley, ed. Morgan (Indianapolis: Hackett, 2002), parenthetically cited by paragraph number (TIE 19). See also: Moira Gatens and Genevieve Lloyd, Collective Imaginings: Spinoza, Past and Present (Routledge, 1999).