Nature Red in Tooth and Claw: Theism and the Problem of Animal Suffering

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Michael J. Murray, Nature Red in Tooth and Claw: Theism and the Problem of Animal Suffering, Oxford University Press, 2008, 209pp., $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199237272.

Reviewed by Mylan Engel Jr., Northern Illinois University


Michael Murray's provocative book addresses 'the Darwinian problem of evil' for theism. In Murray's words: "the Darwinian problem consists in the vast and unquantifiable array of nonhuman-animal suffering that is endemic to the evolutionary machinery -- machinery which has been winnowing unfit organisms from the planet (often kicking and screaming) for nearly three billion years" (pp. 1-2). Murray then cites Darwin's poignant explanation of the problem: "'the sufferings of millions of lower animals throughout almost endless time' are apparently irreconcilable with the existence of a creator of 'unbounded' goodness" (p. 2). Darwin is not alone in expressing this worry. It has seemed to many that the magnitude, variety, intensity and duration of animal suffering provides compelling evidence that God[1] does not exist. Murray's goal is to defang this argument for the irrationality of theism by offering a series of possible explanations for animal suffering, the truth of any one of which would render theism[2] compatible with such suffering.

In Chapter 1, Murray offers what he himself describes as an "opinionated introduction" to the problem of evil designed to "bring novices up to speed" on the discussion of the problem of evil in contemporary philosophy of religion. Those well-versed in philosophy of religion will find much of this chapter familiar terrain. Murray begins by distinguishing the logical argument from evil from the evidential problem of evil.[3] Since the Darwinian problem of evil is at root a version of the evidential argument from evil, it is worth spelling out the latter argument in some detail.

The Darwinian evidential problem maintains that the magnitude of animal suffering in the world provides compelling evidence that God does not exist and that theism is irrational in light of that evidence. The evidential arguer begins with the following definitions:

D1. Gratuitous evil is evil that serves no God-justifying good.

D2. A good g is a God-justifying good for evil e only if (i) g could not have been secured without permitting either e or some other evils equivalent to or worse than e, (ii) g is sufficiently outweighing (i.e., g is a positive good sufficiently valuable to outweigh the disvalue of e), and (iii) it is within God's rights to permit evil e.[4]

It is generally acknowledged by theist and atheist alike that a 3-omnis God[5] would prevent the occurrence of any gratuitous evil whatsoever and that, therefore, gratuitous evil is incompatible with God's existence.[6] Given the incompatibility of God and gratuitous evil, the atheologian argues as follows:

Evidential Argument from Evil (EA)

(1) If God exists, there would be no gratuitous evils.

(2) There are gratuitous evils.


(3) God does not exist. (p. 16)

EA is valid and (1) is true. But what about (2)? The Darwinian evidential arguer admits that we do not know that (2) is true, but argues that the magnitude, variety, intensity, and duration of animal suffering in the world make it reasonable to believe that (2) is true. Since we can discern no God-justifying good that would warrant allowing such a vast amount of intense animal suffering, such suffering seems gratuitous. The apparent gratuitousness of animal suffering, it is argued, makes accepting (2) reasonable, indeed.[7]

Murray contends that there are only three ways for the critic to respond to EA: (i) attack (2) indirectly by accepting (1) and showing that we have good reason to believe that God exists [since the truth of (1) and (~3) together entails (~2)]; (ii) attack (2) directly by showing that we do know God's reasons for permitting the evils in the world; or (iii) argue that the atheist has no good reason to accept that (2) is true (p. 21).

Theodical responses follow tack (ii) and attempt to identify God's actual purposes for allowing specific evils to occur. Murray rejects this approach because he thinks that many of God's actual purposes would be inscrutable. Defenses only seek to show that God's existence is logically compatible with the evils we find in the world. Murray contends that defenses are of little use where evidential arguments are concerned because "they do not aim to provide explanations that undercut the evidential value of evil" (p. 37). Murray embraces approach (iii) and seeks to show that we are not justified in accepting (2). He thinks that the inscrutability response to evidential arguments succeeds in showing that we aren't justified in accepting (2),[8] but he thinks the theist can strengthen her inscrutability response by providing what he calls a 'Causa Dei' explanation.[9] A Causa Dei [CD] explanation is a case offered on behalf of God's innocence in light of the evidence (p. 40). In the present context, a CD is an attempt to show that in light of our justified acceptances, we aren't justified in believing that animal suffering is gratuitous and thus aren't justified in taking such suffering to be evidence of God's nonexistence.

What standards must be met for a CD-explanation of animal suffering to succeed? According to Murray, a successful CD for animal suffering must consist of reasons such that (i) they are true for all the theist knows or justifiably believes, (ii) if true, these reasons would constitute a good explanation for animal suffering (i.e., these reasons would be consistent with theism and would explain why permitting animal suffering would be necessary for securing outweighing goods), and (iii) these reasons need not count as plausible, but rather as as plausible as not, overall (p. 38). Crucial to a successful CD-explanation is that the reasons constituting it be such that we aren't justified in rejecting them given our justified acceptances. Since people differ with respect to what they justifiably accept, tying a CD's success to its compatibility with one's justified acceptances introduces a relativistic element to Murray's approach. Since theists and nontheists will presumably differ with respect to their justified acceptances, an animal-suffering-CD that is successful for the theist might not be successful for the nontheist. Murray welcomes this result, since it leaves open the possibility that a CD might successfully preserve the reasonableness of belief in God for the theist in the face of untold animal suffering (based on what the theist justifiably accepts), without succeeding in deflecting the evidential force of such suffering for the nontheist whose justified acceptances are quite different (p. 39). Perhaps such relativism is unavoidable, but we should be suspicious of solutions to the problem of evil that only work for those already convinced that God exists. Surely, we would and should be more confident in a CD that succeeds for theist and nontheist alike, rather than one that only succeeds relative to a set of acceptances that theists accept and nontheists reject. Murray seems to recognize this point, for he seeks CDs that are consistent with the "common set of justified acceptances endorsed by individuals who are reasonably well-educated in matters of contemporary philosophy and science" (p. 39). In Chapters 2-6, Murray advances several CDs that he claims meet this latter standard. Along the way, he considers a number of other CDs that he argues fail to meet even this minimal standard. In what follows, I will examine the CDs he takes to be successful.

In Chapter 2, Murray draws on recent work in philosophy of mind to develop four neo-Cartesian CDs according to which animals lack the sort of phenomenal consciousness needed to experience pain.[10] One representative neo-Cartesian explanation that Murray proposes appeals to the higher-order theory of phenomenal consciousness. On this view,

For a mental state to be a conscious state (phenomenally) requires an accompanying higher-order mental state (a HOT) that has that state as its intentional object. The HOT must be a thought that one is, oneself, in that first-order state. Only humans have the cognitive faculties required to form the conception of themselves being in a first-order state that one must have in order to have a HOT. (p. 55)

If the HOT-account of phenomenal consciousness were correct and if animals lacked the capacity for HOTs, then animals would be incapable of experiencing pain. Murray claims that we aren't justified in rejecting this neo-Cartesian CD on the basis of our justified acceptances. Here we encounter for the first time a problem that runs throughout the book. Murray never provides an account of epistemic justification that allows us to assess his claims about what we are and aren't justified in accepting. Let's fill in that lacuna now. Presumably, Murray has in mind some form of internalistic justification. On internalistic accounts, justification is a function of one's evidence (either propositional or experiential). Are we justified in rejecting the HOT-account of phenomenal consciousness, i.e., do we have evidence that the HOT-account is false? The answer is "Yes." First, we have reason to think that the HOT-account of phenomenal consciousness is false when applied to humans, because human infants and severely retarded human beings experience (morally significant) pain, even though they aren't capable of forming HOTs.

We also have independent evidence that many animals are capable of experiencing pain, evidence that parallels the evidence we have for thinking our fellow humans are capable of feeling pain: We witness pain behavior, not just reflex actions to noxious stimuli (protective pain), but subsequent pain-induced behavioral modification caused by bodily damage (restorative pain); we observe significant anatomical and neurophysiological similarity between humans and many animals (including all mammals and most vertebrates); endogenous serotonergic and opioid pain-control mechanisms are present in all mammals[11] [Why would organisms incapable of feeling pain have endogenous pain-control systems?]; efferent and afferent nerves run throughout their bodies; analgesics and anesthetics stop animals from exhibiting pain behavior, presumably because these substances prevent the pain itself in much the way they prevent pain in humans; and there is compelling experimental evidence that the capacity to feel pain enhances survival value in animals, based on the self-destructive tendencies displayed by animals that have been surgically deafferented.[12],[13] Based on this cumulative observational, analogical, and experimental evidence, we are clearly justified in accepting that animals can feel pain, and so, we're justified in rejecting any neo-Cartesian explanation that denies animals have this ability, based on what we justifiably accept. Consequently, all neo-Cartesian CDs fail, for they fail to meet even the low bar that Murray sets for CD-success. Neo-Cartesian CDs are not "as plausible as not, overall" given our justified acceptances.

Chapter 3 explores whether Fall-CDs might succeed in reconciling animal suffering with divine goodness. Murray notes: "[F]or almost every major Christian thinker reflecting on evil, the Fall [of Adam] has played a central role in explaining both the origin and persistence of evil in the universe" (p. 74), but Fall-CDs face the problem of pre-Adamic pain [PAP]. Sentient animals pre-date the first humanoids by hundreds of millions of years, and trillions of the unfit among them suffered terribly as natural selection mercilessly eliminated them. After rejecting a young-Earth-CD and a precursive-conditions-CD, Murray defends the Satan-CD. On this CD, all the natural evil in the world, including animal suffering, is the result of the Fall of preternatural beings with morally significant freedom, viz., Satan and his cohorts. Murray contends that our justified acceptances do not justify us in rejecting the Satan-CD. Is the Satan-CD "as plausible as not, overall" given our justified acceptances? To see that it's not, consider a question Murray poses: "Could these beings [Satan and his cohorts] be to blame for the fact that human beings often have bad backs, myopia, liability to cancer and heart disease?" (p. 103). It's logically possible, but that's not the relevant question. What matters is whether we're justified in denying that that possibility is actual, and we are. We have good, scientifically-confirmed, naturalistic explanations for all of the conditions and diseases Murray mentions. We know, e.g., that heart disease is caused by diets high in saturated fat and cholesterol and is exacerbated by a sedentary life-style. We also know that the other diseases mentioned have naturalistic causes,[14] and so, we're justified in rejecting that Satan is their source. The point generalizes. We needn't appeal to Satan to explain any natural phenomenon, and since it's unreasonable to postulate entities beyond necessity, we're justified in denying that Satan exists. Do we know for certain that Satan does not exist? No, but that is not the standard that is required for rejecting a CD. To reject a CD, we must be justified in believing that it is false, and since we're justified in believing that Satan does not exist, we're justified in rejecting the Satan-CD.[15]

In Chapter 4, Murray defends two CDs that attempt to justify animal pain in terms of benefits to the animals themselves. Since both CDs are open to the same objection, I'll only address the first. CD1: Animal pain and suffering are necessary to preserve the integrity of sentient physical organisms engaged in intentional action. The problem with CD1 is that it doesn't take seriously God's omnipotence. The evidential problem of evil is only a problem for rational belief in a particular kind of deity, namely, a 3-omnis God. An omnipotent God can do anything logically possible for God to do that is not inconsistent with any of God's essential divine attributes. All that's required to be justified in rejecting CD1 is that we be justified in believing that it's logically possible to create successful sentient organisms that don't experience pain. Conversely, for CD1 to succeed, pain and suffering must be logically necessary for preserving animal life. It's irrelevant how animal pain happens to function in the actual world. What matters is whether it's logically possible to create thriving sentient creatures that either aren't capable of feeling pain or aren't in environments where their capacity for pain is ever realized. Do we know that this is logically possible? No. But we're justified in believing that it is, since creating such beings and placing them in non-hostile environments involves no contradiction. To think otherwise is to deny that the Garden of Eden is even logically possible. Since we are justified in believing that it is logically possible to create sentient beings and place them in non-hostile environments, the Necessity Condition (see note 4) is not met, and consequently, CD1 fails.[16]

In Chapters 5 and 6, Murray considers and rejects a series of nomic-regularity-CDs, finally settling on the following chaos-to-order [CTO] nomic-regularity-CD: (a) a universe that moves from chaos to order in a law-like way is intrinsically good, (b) real animal suffering is an unavoidable by-product of creating a CTO-nomically-regular universe, and (c) the intrinsic goodness of a CTO-universe outweighs the animal suffering it inevitably produces. Space considerations prevent me from addressing this CD in much detail, but again, we can easily conceive of a universe that moves from chaos to order that doesn't require animal suffering, and so, we're justified in believing that it's logically possible to create a CTO-universe without the evil of animal suffering. Thus, we're justified in believing that the Necessity Condition is not satisfied. We're also justified in believing that the Outweighing Condition (see note 4) is not satisfied. Even if we grant that a CTO-universe that proceeds from chaos to order and is rife with animal suffering is to some degree intrinsically better than a universe orderly from the start with no attendant animal suffering (and there is no good reason to grant this), the modest amount of increased intrinsic goodness would not outweigh the unfathomable amount of pain and suffering endured by billions of animals over hundreds of millions of years.[17][18] Thus, we're justified in rejecting this CD as well.

For the reasons just outlined, I think that the book fails on its own terms. The purportedly "successful" CDs that Murray identifies don't meet the minimal standard for CD-success that Murray himself lays down -- none of these CDs are "as plausible as not, overall" given our justified acceptances. I've argued that we're justified in rejecting each of the CDs Murray thinks successful, but even if I am mistaken on that count, the Darwinian problem of evil still threatens to undermine the rationality of theism. Here's why. The theist admits that the truth of (2) entails that God does not exist. So, belief in God is reasonable only if we have reason to believe that (2) is false. CD-explanations provide no such reason. Even if successful, they only show that the atheist isn't entitled to claim that (2) is true. Murray has given us no reason to think that (2) is false, and absent such a reason, it is not reasonable to believe that God exists.

To Murray's credit the book is clearly written and would make a useful addition to philosophy of religion courses, especially those focusing on the problem of evil. The book is instructive, not because it undermines the evidential problem of evil from animal suffering, but because it illustrates just how bleak the theist's prospects are for handling this enduring challenge to the rationality of theistic belief.

I end with a moral worry. In Chapter 2, Murray admits that we don't know that neo-Cartesianism is true, and there, he offers an argument from moral caution that since we don't know the neo-Cartesian view is correct, it would be morally reckless to act as if we knew animals were incapable of suffering. But in Chapter 7, he downplays the significance of animal suffering. There, he claims that we have reason to believe that animal pain and suffering is not as bad as human pain and suffering, and returning to the neo-Cartesian CDs, he claims that "it is hard to know how 'bad' those states are" (p. 193). Human psychology is such that the less bad we think some evil is, the less we're willing to do to prevent it. Downplaying the moral significance of animal suffering makes it likely that some readers will be less inclined to take conscious steps to avoid contributing to such suffering. It would be both sad and ironic if Murray's attempt at explaining away the evidential problem of animal suffering had the evil end result of making theists more inclined to contribute to that very suffering.

[1] Where God =df the one and only supreme necessary being who is omniscient, omnipotent, omnibenevolent, creator of the universe, self-existent, eternal, perfectly wise and just, and possesses personhood.

[2] Where theism =df the belief that God, as defined in note 1, exists.

[3] He then offers a version of the free will defense in response to the logical problem, while endorsing an inscrutability response to the evidential problem.

[4] Murray himself doesn't use the locution 'God-justifying good', but he does endorse definition D2, for he writes:

What would it take to have a morally sufficient reason for permitting an evil? Three conditions must be met.

(A) The Necessity Condition: the good secured by the permission of the evil, E, could not have been secured without permitting either E or some other evils morally equivalent to or worse than E.

(B) The Outweighing Condition: the good secured by the permission of the evil is sufficiently outweighing.

(C) The Rights Condition: it is within the rights of the one permitting the evil to permit it. (p. 14)

[5] By a '3-omnis God' I mean an omniscient, omnipotent, omnibenevolent God, as defined in note 1.

[6] One exception is Peter van Inwagen. In his The Problem of Evil (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2006), van Inwagen argues that God's existence might be compatible with a slight amount of gratuitous evil using the following analogy: Suppose the desired punitive effect for a given crime could be obtained with a 9-year-364-day sentence, but that the judge sentences the criminal to 10 years in prison. That extra day is gratuitous, but van Inwagen insists that it would be perfectly permissible for the judge to issue such a sentence. I'm inclined to think that it would be wrong of the judge to do so, if he knew that one day less would achieve the desired punitive effect equally well, but suppose I'm wrong on that. Still, if a 9-year-364-day sentence would suffice it would clearly be wrong for the judge to hand out a 20-year sentence. So, while it might be permissible for God to allow some minimal amount of gratuitous evil, it would clearly be wrong for God to allow an excessive amount of gratuitous evil, and so, an excessive amount of gratuitous evil surely is incompatible with God's existence. The evidential argument from animal suffering can easily be couched as an argument designed to show that an excessive amount of gratuitous animal suffering exists and that therefore God does not.

[7] The Darwinian evidential arguer's argument for the reasonableness of (2) can be reconstructed as follows:

Darwinian Argument from Inscrutable to Gratuitous Evil

(4) There are countless instances of horrific animal suffering (each of which is intrinsically evil) such that, even after careful reflection, we can discern no God-justifying goods that would permit them.

(5) Since we can discern no God-justifying goods that would permit these countless instances of intrinsically-evil animal suffering, these evils seem pointless and entirely gratuitous.

(6) Since these instances of evil seem gratuitous, it is reasonable to believe that they are gratuitous.


(7) It is reasonable to believe that gratuitous evil exists.

[8] Murray utilizes an inscrutability reply to reject such "direct arguments" like the one offered in note 7. He contends that to reasonably accept premise (5), we would need a good reason to think that we are epistemically well-positioned to judge that there are no goods that God aims to bring about of which we are unaware, that would justify the permission of such suffering. Murray insists that God's reasons for allowing such suffering would be inscrutable if present and thus concludes that we cannot infer the nonexistence of such reasons from their inscrutability. Accordingly, he maintains that since we are poorly positioned with respect to God's purposes for allowing animal sufferings, the appearance of their gratuitousness is not trustworthy. (p. 29)

[9] Murray borrows the notion of "Causa Dei" explanations from Leibniz. The last section of Leibniz's Theodicy is entitled "De Causa Dei" which, according to Murray, "is a phrase borrowed from juridical contexts referring to the case offered at trial on behalf of a defendant's innocence" (p. 40). To say that a case is offered de causa X is to say that it is offered "on behalf of X's innocence in light of the evidence" (p. 40). The point of offering a case de causa X is to show that the evidence we are justified in accepting is compatible with X's innocence, thus undermining the prosecution's case for X's guilt. In simple terms, a CD is a just-so story we're not justified in rejecting which if true would explain how a particular evil is compatible with divine goodness.

[10] Strictly speaking, the neo-Cartesian proposals Murray considers are not CDs, because they do not offer reasons that would explain why permitting animal suffering would be necessary for securing some outweighing God-justifying good. Rather, they seek to show that there is no animal suffering to reconcile with God's existence. Even so, Murray treats these neo-Cartesian explanations as CDs, because they "will still have to meet the same epistemic standards the genuine CDs do; that is, they must still be such that we are not warranted or justified in rejecting them given our reasonable acceptances" (p. 42).

[11] For a fuller discussion of this point, see Margaret Rose and David Adams, "Evidence for Pain and Suffering in Other Animals" in Animal Experimentation: The Consensus Changes, ed. Gill Langley (New York: Chapman and Hall, 1989). There, Rose and Adams point out endogenous opiates even occur in invertebrates such as the earthworm (pp. 54-55).

[12] The infamous case of the Silver Spring monkeys provides clear scientific evidence of the negative effects of deafferentation and reveals the important role pain perception plays in maintaining bodily integrity in animals. The Silver Spring monkeys were subjects of research carried out by Dr. Taub at the Institute for Behavioral Research in the late 1970s and early 1980s. Twelve of the seventeen monkeys had disabled limbs as a result of surgical deafferentation. By the end of the study, 39 of the fingers on the monkeys' deafferented hands were severely deformed or missing, having been either torn or bitten off. For details, see Alex Pacheco and Anna Francione, "The Silver Spring", in In Defense of Animals, ed. Peter Singer (New York: Harper and Row, 1985).

[13] These justification-conferring observations aren't new. Voltaire offered a similar reply to Descartes:

Barbarians seize this dog, which in friendship surpasses man so prodigiously; they nail it on a table, and they dissect it alive in order to show the mesenteric veins. You discover in it all the same organs of feeling that are in yourself. Answer me, machinist, has nature arranged all the means of feeling in this animal, so that it may not feel? has it nerves in order to be impassible? Do not suppose this impertinent contradiction in nature.

(Voltaire, Philosophical Dictionary, "Animals," reprinted in Animal Rights and Human Obligations, second edition, eds. Tom Regan and Peter Singer (Upper Saddle River, NJ: Prentice Hall, 1989), p. 21).

[14] For example, we know that some cancers (viz., cancers of the colon, prostate, and breast) are caused by the same sort of high-fat, low-fiber diets and sedentary life-styles that cause heart disease. Other cancers are caused by viruses (Cervical cancer is caused by the human papillomavirus.). Still other cancers are caused by environmental factors (like asbestos and tobacco smoke).

[15] Here Murray might retreat to the claim that at least theists aren't justified in rejecting the Satan-CD, but then he will have abandoned all pretense of providing a CD that comports with the "common set of justified acceptances endorsed by individuals who are reasonably well-educated in matters of contemporary philosophy and science." I suspect that the Satan-CD will even fail for most theists, because given what they justifiably accept, it is not "as plausible as not, overall" that Satan is the source of pre-Adamic animal suffering.

[16] It may seem odd that Murray puts forth this CD, since it's success depends on the logical impossibility of neo-Cartesianism, a view he defended as plausible in Chapter 2. To be fair, Murray admits that the neo-Cartesian CDs of Chapter 2 and CD1 of Chapter 4 are inconsistent. He doesn't think that matters. All that matters on his view is that one of the many competing (and sometimes inconsistent) CDs he identifies be such that (i) we are not justified in rejecting it, based on our justified acceptances, and (ii) its truth would reconcile animal suffering with divine goodness.

[17] I'm not suggesting that conceivability entails logical possibility. It doesn't. There are clear counterexamples to the conceivability criterion of logical possibility (as when two noncompossible states of affairs are equally conceivable), but the conceivability and noncontradictoriness of a state of affairs S gives us prima facie justification for thinking that S is logically possible.

[18] Elsewhere in the text, Murray admits that a good that could only be attained by permitting "creatures to live lives that were perpetually and unrelentingly filled with pain, misery, and devastation … would not be outweighing, but would rather be outweighed" (p. 87). For billions upon billions of unfit organisms, their brief lives are filled with unrelenting pain, misery, and devastation. Accordingly, even if a CTO-universe is intrinsically good, we are justified in believing that this good is not sufficiently good to outweigh all of its attendant animal suffering.