Nature's Challenge to Free Will

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Bernard Berofsky, Nature's Challenge to Free Will, Oxford University Press, 2012, 280pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199640010.

Reviewed by Ishtiyaque Haji, University of Calgary


You have free will regarding an action only if you have the ability both to perform and to refrain from performing it. Let compatibilism be the thesis that determinism is compatible with free will. Incompatibilism is the denial of compatibilism. Traditional compatibilists hold that if your action was free, then you could have refrained from performing it had you wanted or tried to do so. Humean compatibilists affirm that at least with respect to some free, deterministically caused actions, you could have done otherwise given exactly the same past and the laws. In his new book, Bernard Berofsky defends vital elements of Humean compatibilism.

This admirable, rigorously argued, and thoroughly researched work takes up several significant issues; only some will be touched on here. It has been thought that if determinism threatens free will, it does so for one of two reasons. Free decisions may require our having alternative possibilities ("counterfactual power"); but as the famous consequence argument purports to show, determinism effaces such power. Or, free decisions may require self-determination (we are their ultimate sources); but determinism precludes such sourcehood. Addressing (in chapter 2) the self-determination component of free will, Berofsky proposes that the deliberative self engages in practical reasoning to make decisions whereas the reflective self issues judgments concerning the direction in which our choices are leading us by, for example, reflecting on our ideals (23-24). Deliberative autonomy (D-autonomy) concerns the former activity, and reflective autonomy (R-autonomy) the latter. Each of these activities, if autonomous is "sincere, informed, stable, mentally healthy (at least minimally), rational, reflective, and independent" (23). Weak D-autonomy and weak R-autonomy do not require that one could have deliberated differently. A person who possesses both these weak components possesses weak DR-autonomy, the self-determination constituent of free will.

If autonomy demands such powers of rational reflection, and so presupposes our having an evaluative perspective, but elements of such a perspective, at least in early childhood, depend vitally on numerous contingences, how is the problem of ultimate sourcehood evaded? Berofsky's response (in chapter 3) draws on two interesting insights. First, if critical review requires a basis for evaluation, and none of these starting points is (initially) better than any other, then autonomy is not compromised if the child, as it must, begins with any of them. Second, having acquired the building blocks of critical reflection, the key question is whether various desires, beliefs, values, and so forth are "held in virtue of the grounds that would justify its adoption to any rational agent, should such grounds exist" (36).

In chapter 4 Berofsky argues against various incompatibilists that if determinism is a threat to free will, the threat derives solely from its alleged threat to counterfactual power and not to autonomy. As for counterfactual power, in chapter 5 he discards conditionalist accounts of compatibilism, including new dispositionalist accounts.

In chapter 6, Berofsky defends causal compatibilism (CC), the thesis that the "existence of bona fide scientific laws linking antecedent mental states with consequent states such as decisions and actions is not precluded by the existence of (possibly deterministic) physical laws accounting for the physical processes underlying the mental ones" (97). Berofsky attempts to show that the arguments of various "CC theorists" fail to secure the existence of psychological laws. He also questions the position that physical determination precludes psychological determination because of the purported causal irrelevance of the mental arising from its supervenience on the physical. However, championing the autonomy of the psychological, he buttresses the generalization argument for CC: if we think of the world as

an ordered hierarchy of groups of properties, each group supervenient upon its base, then causal irrelevance will transmit upward from physics all the way to chemistry, then to biology, and perhaps . . . to economics and biology . . . . Psychology is then no longer a special case (109).

This would leave us with only physical laws and with causation confined solely to the physical level. The argument is bolstered by noting that "there are intervening layers of properties and laws between psychology and physics" (111). For example, assuming psychological states supervene on pertinent states studied by the neurosciences, neural transmission itself involves processes that are subject to "more fundamental physical sciences, such as chemistry and electromagnetism" (111). The previously outlined generalization argument could be extended to eliminate the causal relevance of the many intervening levels below psychology. The "limitations this would impose on scientific theorizing would be catastrophic" (113).

In chapter 7, Berofsky dissects the consequence argument. According to this argument, if determinism is true, all our actions are consequences of the remote past and the laws of nature. But no one has any control over, and so cannot alter, the past or the laws of nature; these things are not "up to us." Hence, if determinism is true, none of our actions is up to us either. Berofsky raises interesting, preliminary concerns with the argument including the following: if the argument appeals solely to the laws of physics, then it will not license conclusions such as "it is up to Ish to decide to review Berofsky's book." Suppose the psychological state, Ish's deciding to review Berofsky's book, strongly supervenes on some physical state in that, among other things, such supervenience rules out mental causation. This would allow for a reformulation of the consequence argument with the conclusion that no one has control with respect to the physical states that subvene relevant psychological ones (127-28). Free decision would still be ruled out, however, not by determinism, but lack of autonomy. Decisions made solely "as a result of purely physical or neurological features of our brain do not count as free decisions -- they cannot count as self-determined" (128). In the remainder of this chapter, there is an informative discussion on problems concerning a suitable characterization of determinism.

Even granting two major premises of the consequence argument -- the laws plus the past entail all truths, and the past is unalterable -- to sustain a mainstay of Humean compatibilism, Berofsky rejects the premise that no one can falsify a law of nature. He ventures (in chapters 8 and 9) that there is some evidence that the psychological laws of decision-making are not unalterable in the sense that fundamental laws of physics are (144-46); and arguments are required to show that whatever distinguishes laws from non-law regularities implies that no one has the power to falsify a law. But the arguments on offer are inconclusive, and prominent philosophers of science ultimately concede that laws are not unalterable.

Necessitarians hold that the laws of nature are nomically necessary in a sense of "necessity" that sustains the conclusion that no one can falsify such laws. If laws govern the universe, and psychological laws are bona fide laws, then they too "fall under some governance principle" (177). In chapter 10, Berofsky examines and rejects primary candidate governance principles. This comprises one part of Humean compatibilism's defense. Humean Supervenience is the thesis that nomic facts are completely determined by nonnomic facts -- the relevant generalizations which, according to the Humean compatibilist, distinguish laws from other true nonnomic generalizations (189). Berofsky defends Humean supervenience against J. W. Carroll's "Mirror Argument" and its earlier variations (195-99). This comprises a second part of Humean compatibilism's defense. In chapter 11, Berofsky shows that it is false that laws are distinguished from other true generalizations in virtue of possessing a special sort of necessity. Rather, laws can be understood in terms of important de facto generalizations. According to David Lewis' best systems analysis (BSA), a law of nature is a contingent generalization that is a theorem (or axiom) in each of the true deductive systems that achieves a best combination of simplicity and strength. Berofsky rejects BSA because of difficulties in characterizing informativeness, simplicity, and the measure by which the balance in question is quantified (212-21). He opts for a view that establishes "lawhood by showing that a generalization fulfills principles of systematicity" (190). These principles derive partly from the work of James Woodward and Christopher Hitchcock (2003) on "invariant generalizations" (218-30). This comprises the third part of Humean compatibilism's defense.

In the final chapter, Berofsky explains why the Humean compatibilist, just like the libertarian, can endorse a non-conditionalist account of our being able to choose otherwise on occasions when we make free choices. Since nomic necessity is nonexistent, the laws do not, for example, deprive Ish from refraining from making the decision to review Berofsky's book. Suppose we understand physical possibility in this way: x's occurring at t is physically possible in world, W, if and only if x's occurring at t is consistent with the laws of nature in W together with the state of W at all times prior to t. If Berofsky's Humean conception of laws of nature is correct, then some agents (metaphysically) can do some things that it is physically impossible to do. This does not entail that one is free to break the laws. Rather, on a Humean conception of laws, if one had decided to do something other than what one freely decided to do, the laws would have been different.

Finally, Humean compatibilism evades the luck objection that some have claimed plagues purportedly free indeterministic decisions: if an agent decides to do one thing, but given exactly the same past and the laws, could have decided to do something else instead, then it seems that this cross-world difference is a matter of luck. Berofsky's rebuttal is that "Agents may decide after reflection, exercising full direct control . . . over the decision, even if there is no sufficient explanation. There may be no sufficient reason for both decisions; but free will does not call upon this level of rationality" (252).

This rich and appealing work, refreshingly focusing on aspects of, or elements that bear on, the free will debate that have been insufficiently addressed, deserves, and will undoubtedly attract close critical scrutiny. My evaluative comments will be brief.

First, semicompatibilists regarding moral responsibility have proposed that although determinism may undermine our having free will, it does not undermine the control that moral responsibility presupposes because this control does not require our having access to alternatives. Drawing on Frankfurt examples, they may adopt a similar position regarding free action. There is little in the book that addresses this position. Berofsky, though, is perfectly clear on his relevant objective: his work is directed to incompatibilists who deny free will under determinism (250).

Second, regarding the freedom requirements of various normative appraisals other than responsibility appraisals, such as those of moral obligation, Berofsky's stance that people can enjoy two-way control with respect to their free decisions and actions despite these choices or actions being determined, if true, would be highly welcome. This is because, independently of an individual's views regarding semicompatibilism concerning responsibility, obligation does require two-way "plural intentional" control (Haji 2012). Thus, if determinism is true, to accommodate obligation, a person might attempt to defend an account of "can do otherwise" along the lines of the traditional conditional analysis or the new dispositional analyses. Berofsky, with others, is skeptical about the prospects of these sorts of analyses. Even if a person could uphold, for example, a dispositionalist view, incompatibilists regarding determinism and obligation will, in all likelihood, remain unmollified. Against these sorts of compatibilists about determinism and obligation, they may well insist that obligation (like responsibility) requires that we have "strong" alternatives: consistent with the past and the laws being what they are, a person could have done otherwise. The Humean compatibilist, of course, could deliver the goods.

Third, there is reason to be less sanguine than Berofsky seems to be regarding whether the Humean compatibilist can escape a worry about acting on the basis of reasons that proponents of supposedly indeterministic free choice confront. To explain, accounts of acting for a reason generally require that the connection between the agent's having the reason and her action comprise, partly, the exercise of a certain degree of control by the agent. An agent's active control in making a decision consists in apt agent-involving events causing nondeviantly that decision. Imagine that in the actual world, W, Peg has reasons, R1, to decide to A, and she also has reasons, R2, to decide to B. Suppose she indeterministically decides to A. Assume, furthermore, that there is an apt explanation of Peg's deciding to A in W: R1 nondeviantly cause her decision. It is vitally important that there be such a causal explanation because event-causal libertarians agree that active control is necessary for freedom-level control, and active control just consists in one's actions being appropriately caused by one's reason states. Because Peg at t indeterministically decides to A in W, there is a world, W*, that has the same natural laws as W, and is past-wise indiscernible from W, right up or just prior to t in which at t Peg decides to do something other than A -- at t she decides to B. However, is there an appropriate connection between her reason states and her deciding to B in this world, W*, to ensure that Peg exercises active control in deciding to B in W*?

In a nutshell, the problem is this: in virtue of what it is true or what does Peg do to make it the case that R2 rather than R1 prevail in W*, given that the laws and the past up until t are fixed? Confine attention to this scenario: In W* (unlike in W) something -- a belief -- comes to Peg's mind at the very time, t, she makes the decision to A, and the event of the belief's coming to mind is a cause of her decision to A (but not one that precedes her decision to A). Furthermore, it is indeterministic whether this belief comes to her mind at t. Assume that, consistent with the past and the natural laws being what they are, while this belief comes to her mind in W* -- event E -- it does not in W. The libertarian might pronounce that we now have a perfectly cogent causal explanation, in terms of actional elements, of Peg's deciding to B in W*: event E is the difference maker. At the time of choice, no such belief comes to Peg's mind in W. However, because the belief does come to her mind at the time she makes the decision at t to B in W*, and E is a cause of her deciding to B, there is, in principle, no mystery about the appropriate causal history of her deciding at t to B in W*.

However, this won't do. Recall, it is indeterministic whether the pertinent belief comes to Peg's mind in W*. In some W*-like worlds, the belief at t comes to Peg's mind, and Peg decides at t to B; in other such worlds, this belief fails to come to Peg's mind at t, and she still decides at t to B. But because these latter W*-like worlds do not differ in any respect from W right up to the time, t, of decision, Peg decides at t to A in W, there appears to be no causal explanation of Peg's deciding at t to B in these W*-like worlds. In these worlds her reason states seem not to be appropriately connected to her deciding to B owing to their favoring her deciding to A, and there is no difference maker, such as event E, that distinguishes these worlds from W.

Berofsky might propose that in W*, Peg exercises direct active control in deciding to B where this species of control "is control not through control of causal factors, like reasons" (64). If it is not such control, what sort of causal control (if it is causal control) is it, given that event causal libertarians eschew agent causation? To finish off, the Humean compatibilist inherits this same sort of concern about acting for reasons.


Haji, I. 2012. Reason's Debt to Freedom. New York: Oxford University Press.

Woodward, J. and Hitchock, C. 2003. "Explanatory Generalizations, Part I: A Counterfactual Account." Nous 37: 1-24.