Nature's Metaphysics: Laws and Properties

Placeholder book cover

Alexander Bird, Nature's Metaphysics: Laws and Properties, Oxford University Press, 2007, 231pp., $66.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199227013.

Reviewed by John W. Carroll, North Carolina State University


This is a rewarding book. In terms of area, it has one foot firmly planted in metaphysics and the other just as firmly set in the philosophy of science. Nature's Metaphysics is distinctive for its thorough and detailed defense of fundamental, natural properties as essentially dispositional and for its description of how these dispositional properties are thus suited to sustain the laws of nature as (metaphysically) necessary truths.

After a useful introductory first chapter, Chapters 2 and 3 set out Bird's metaphysics and his account of the modality of laws. The heart of his metaphysics is dispositional essentialism (DE), the view that at least some fundamental, natural properties have dispositional essences (p. 45). ('Natural' here serves to indicate that there aren't too many of these properties -- there is not a property for every predicate. 'Fundamental' here means scientifically fundamental, part of the true physics.) Bird holds a strong form of DE: dispositional monism (DM); it is the view that all fundamental, natural properties have dispositional essences. Bird's idea is that the essence of any fundamental, natural property includes a certain conditional relationship between that property's manifestation property and its stimulus property. So, the mere existence of a fundamental, natural property makes it necessary that, if something with the property also has the stimulus property then, in addition, it has the manifestation property. To Bird, this universally quantified conditional has the requisite non-accidentality and generality to qualify as a law. (I consider this the key argument in the book. I take a closer look at it below.) Chapter 4 reveals problems for David Lewis's and David Armstrong's accounts of laws; in a nice departure from the existing literature, Bird's focus is on the problems that stem from Lewis's and Armstrong's denials of DE.

Chapters 5-9 are detailed replies to possible objections to DE, DM, and his account of laws. More specifically, Chapter 5 addresses objections to DE. Chapter 6 considers a regress objection to DM and Chapter 7 considers structural properties (e.g., being triangular) as putative counterexamples to DM. Chapter 8 defends the thesis that all laws are necessarily true. Since all this metaphysical work is being done by the dispositional essences of fundamental, natural properties, the laws might seem somehow gratuitous. Nevertheless, in Chapter 9, Bird explains why he is not prepared to deny that there are laws. In this ninth chapter, he also completes the account of laws started in Chapter 3. Chapter 10, the concluding chapter, includes some summary and some interesting discussion of how well the laws of current physics fit with Bird's philosophy.

There is too much of merit to do justice to anywhere near all the interesting philosophical issues raised in Nature's Metaphysics. But, it also would be a shame not to engage with at least some of them. So, I'll begin by filling in the specifics of the key argument, "the core of the dispositional essentialist explanation of laws" (p. 46). This will let me identify some straightforwardly problematic steps in the argument and also some steps that subtly introduce some crucial and risky assumptions.

The key argument is a derivation that starts from a conditional analysis of dispositions:

(CA) D(S,M)x ↔ (Sx □→ Mx).

'D(S,M)x' abbreviates 'x is disposed to manifest M in response to stimulus S' and '□→ ' expresses the counterfactual conditional. Defenders of (CA) will take it to be necessarily true. So, they will also hold:

(CA) □(D(S,M)x ↔ (Sx □→ Mx)).

DE tells us that at least one fundamental, natural property is essentially dispositional. Like Bird, I will use 'P' to pick out an arbitrary one of these properties. So, according to Bird, DE tells us:

(DEP) □∀x(Px → D(S,M)),

where 'S' and 'M' are no longer bound variables. Instead, they pick out a specific stimulus property and a corresponding specific manifestation property associated with P. Hence Bird is assuming that P is at least partly the disposition to manifest M in response to S.

In (DEP), substitute for 'D(S,M)' according to (CA) to derive:

(I) □∀x(Px → (Sx □→ Mx)),

from which it follows that

(V) □∀x((Px & Sx) → Mx))


(V) ∀x((Px & Sx) → Mx)).

Bird contends that (V) is a "nomic generalization" (p. 46). Why is (V) nomic? Well, P is a fundamental, natural property -- a property to be found in the true physics. It is also essentially dispositional. In addition, Bird's derivation of (V) shows that (V) is non-accidental in a very strong sense. Thus, the scientifically fundamental status of the disposition P, the non-accidentality of (V), and (I would add) the intuitive (though hard-to-specify) conceptual ties connecting dispositions, laws, causation, explanation, and the other nomic concepts come together to make a convincing case that (V) is nomic in some way. Given that (V) is also suitably general, it is no great stretch to conclude that (V) is a law.[1]

Bird has apparently established that there is at least one law that is necessarily true. The necessitarian tradition that he is working from, however, makes the much stronger claim that all laws are necessarily true. To this end, Bird asks us to consider two different stances one might take about the modality of laws:

(PNL) At least some laws are necessary.

(FNL) All laws are necessary.

Then, in one of the few disappointing passages of the book, we are given Bird's reasons for favoring (FNL):

Accepting (PNL) but not (FNL) would give us a mixed view of laws, some explained as consequences of (DE) while others are explained à la façon de Lewis or à la façon d'Armstrong. This would seem to be an untidy metaphysic, with two classes of laws. Theorists have always sought a unified account of laws (p. 49).

In brief, if only some laws are necessary, then one is stuck with an untidy metaphysic and so a failed account of laws.

All of this is the basis for what is Bird's first attempt at a dispositional essentialist account of laws:

laws are those regularities whose truth is guaranteed by the essentially dispositional nature of one or more of the constituent properties, in the way that (V) is guaranteed by the dispositional nature of P (pp. 46-47).

Right after stating this, he takes it back a bit, saying that among the laws are also generalizations that supervene on these guaranteed-to-be-true regularities. We have to wait until Chapter 9 to get the final revision, which is prompted by the worry that, if one allows the supervening generalizations in, too many regularities are counted as laws; "The general relations will be abundant" (p. 201). Bird doesn't give specific counterexamples to counting all the supervening generalizations as laws, but the problem clearly stems from the fact that all necessary truths supervene on everything. So, the worry seems to be that, say, true mathematical generalizations or true tautologies that intuitively are not laws would be mistakenly counted as such. In reply, Bird tries to describe a unity among what sorts of regularities are tagged with the label 'law' in ordinary language, and this ultimately leads him to his final proposal:

The laws of a domain are the fundamental, general explanatory relationships between kinds, quantities, and qualities of that domain, that supervene upon the essential nature of those things (p. 201).

('Fundamental' here means fundamental relative to the domain in question.) There is a lot that might be challenged about this account, especially the suggested domain relativity of lawhood, but for the questions I want to raise it is only really important to understand the central idea. It is this: Start with the regularities derivable from a contained property as (V) was from the dispositional nature of P, see what supervenes on these regularities, but then among the supervenient generalizations focus in on the ones that are explanatory. Right there, those are the laws.

Where lie the troublesome steps? They reside with (i) the argument from the necessity of one law to the necessity of all laws, (ii) the role of explanation and supervenience in Bird's final version of the dispositional essentialist account of laws, and (iii) a critical assumption Bird makes about the dispositional nature of fundamental, natural properties in starting his key derivation with (DEP) and (CA).

First, suppose that Bird has succeeded in showing that (V) is a law and is necessarily true. Will concerns about unification establish that all laws are necessarily true? I do not see how. Why couldn't there be a perfectly unified account of laws that counts (V) as a law and also counts some contingent generalizations as laws too? After all, the most naive regularity account does so in a perfectly unified way: P is a law if and only if P is a universal generalization and P is true. For another example, consider an account that says that P is a law if and only if P is a true generalization explained by the fundamental aspects of the universe, where these fundamental aspects include at least the fundamental, natural properties. Then, so long as both contingent regularities and necessary ones could be explained by the fundamental aspects of the universe, (V) and also some contingent generalizations might count as laws. Finally, consider Marc Lange's account of laws,[2] which analyzes lawhood in terms of membership in a counterfactually stable set of propositions. His idea is that the set of laws is special in that each of its members would still be true under any counterfactual supposition consistent with the set itself. Not surprisingly, both contingent truths and necessary truths turn out to be laws. None of these accounts make lawhood an un-unified property.

The second concern I have about the key argument of Nature's Metaphysics is that the final account of laws offered by Bird lacks the elegance of his first attempt. Initially, no additional modal or nomic notions are introduced besides the necessity embodied in (DE) and (CA). This is an important attraction of necessitarianism: "We don't need a multiplicity of necessities, we need just one" (p. 48). However, in Bird's final account, the nomic notion of explanation is included. What's more, this notion does all the interesting work. All necessary truths supervene on everything. So, when the supervenience clause is introduced into Bird's account, derivability from dispositional essences becomes an excess element of the account. One can just require that laws be necessarily true, leaving out any mention of the essential nature of the fundamental, natural properties. The only interesting work left to do is to cut the laws from the herd of necessary truths, and that work is done in the final account by considerations about what explains what.

Third, despite appearances, Bird has not established a connection from the existence of any fundamental, natural property with a dispositional essence to the existence of a specific manifestation property and a specific stimulus property. Obviously, there is no guarantee that we are in a position to know the properties of the true physics. But, even working from the natural properties of current physics, there is the question of whether these properties are dispositional in the specific way that Bird assumes they are. Ordinary dispositions and fundamental, natural properties are not usually picked out using what Bird calls overt disposition descriptions (ones that explicitly mention a manifestation property and a stimulus property). They are expressed by what Bird calls covert disposition names (e.g., 'courage' or 'charge'). Whether any ordinary disposition or any fundamental, natural property really is a disposition to M in response to S is a question with no easy answer. Bird is aware of this potential difficulty:

Covert disposition names and overt disposition descriptions may both denote properties, but we should not assume that there is a straightforward analysis of the former in terms of the latter (p. 20).

But he also seems to think that he can bypass this issue by focusing "primarily on overt dispositions" (p. 24), formulating (DEP) and (CA) with overt locutions. The problem is that this undercuts the plausibility of the claim that his key derivation has anything to do with laws of nature.[3] As pointed out above, it is important that the property P that (DEP) is about be a fundamental, natural property, a property of the true physics. Otherwise there is little reason to think that the derivation spits out the truth or necessity of even one law. Do the derivation starting with the disposition to cry in response to peeling onions or the disposition to be colored in response to being red, and see if there is still the same intuitive pull for thinking that the resulting generalization (V) is nomic or lawful. Admittedly there is some brief discussion of how inertial mass (p. 20) and charge (p. 22) might be made overtly dispositional, but without more the relevance of the key derivation to the problem of laws is threatened.

The derivation itself is sensitive to the assumptions one makes about the nature of dispositions. Consider the property of being fragile, the disposition to break. One could question whether the disposition to break is identical to the disposition to break in response to being struck. The surface grammar of these two expressions suggests that these are distinct dispositions. An intuitive example confirms this: The hot, liquid glass isn't fragile -- it is not disposed to break; but, arguably, it is disposed to break in response to being stuck because, if it were cooled to room temperature, it would break in response to being struck. One convinced by these considerations might hold that no specific stimulus property is associated with the disposition to break; one might hold instead that what it important is that there be a stimulus that would cause the break. Maybe, x is disposed to break if and only if there is a stimulus S, such that, if x were S, then x would break. In this spirit, let 'DMx' abbreviate 'x is disposed to M'. Then, instead of Bird's (CA) and (DEP), the derivation should start with:

(CA′) DMx if and only if (∃S)(Sx □→ Mx)


(DE′P) □∀x(Px → DMx).

Substituting for 'DMx' in (DE′P) in accord with (CA′), we get:

(I′) □∀x(Px → (∃S)(Sx □→ Mx)).

But, from here, though (V) will be true for some S (it will be true for the stimulus property that would actually lead an x that is P to manifest M), it doesn't follow that this generalization will be necessarily true. In other words, (V) does not follow.  Among the worlds where P is instantiated, a property S1 might make P things manifest M in some of those worlds but not in others.  As far as  (I′) is concerned, there might be a different relevant stimulus property for P in every possible world. So, no necessarily true conditional linking any one stimulus property to the manifestation condition follows, at least not without some additional assumptions.[4] Thus, not only the relevance of the derivation to the problem of laws, but the derivation itself depends on the plausibility of the structural assumptions one makes about the fundamental, natural properties.

What I like best about Nature's Metaphysics is that Bird has pushed to the forefront of the dialectic specific necessitarian assumptions. The book provides a detailed proposal about how laws are essential to the properties they contain. I have focused on his key derivation and his account of laws, material found primarily in Chapters 2, 3, and 9. But, every chapter exhibits this same kind of detailed (and dreadfully clever) discussion. It is the kind of discussion that is rare in the necessitarian literature. To my mind, my misgivings do not undermine the necessitarian project. Indeed, they might ultimately reveal the benefit to that project of continuing to tackle the hard issues in the manner of Bird.[5]

[1] In Chapter 3, Bird is non-committal as to whether (V) is a law or merely a regularity entailed by a relation between the properties in (V) that, strictly speaking, is the entity which is the law. By Chapter 9, with his mention of general explanatory relationships, Bird may seem to lean toward the latter view, but one should keep in mind that these relationships might just be ones of extensional inclusion (p. 200). To keep things simple, and hereby revealing my own leaning, I'll ignore this complication, putting everything in terms of the regularity option.

[2] Natural Laws in Scientific Practice, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2000.

[3] There is nothing in the seemingly innocuous (DE) that tells us that any of the fundamental, natural properties is essentially dispositional in the manner required by (DEP). If 'having a dispositional essence' as it is used in (DE) just means 'being disposed to manifest M in response to S' for some M and some S, then (DE) isn't nearly as innocuous as it may have first seemed.

[4] It is interesting to note, for example, that if the subjunctive conditional is treated as the strict conditional, 'P □→ Q' = '□ (P → Q)', then there is a property S that makes (V) true. Given Bird's desire to minimize modalities, this might be an assumption he would be willing to make. This view of counterfactuals is developed, among other places, in Kai von Fintel's "Counterfactuals in a Dynamic Context" in Ken Hale: A Life in Language, M. Kenstowicz (ed.), Cambridge: MIT Press, 2001. 

[5] Thank you to Marc Lange for helpful comments on a draft of this review.