Nature's Suit: Husserl's Phenomenological Philosophy of the Physical Sciences

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Lee Hardy, Nature's Suit: Husserl's Phenomenological Philosophy of the Physical Sciences, Ohio University Press, 2013, 248pp., $ 34.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780821420669.

Reviewed by Michele Averchi, The Catholic University of America


Lee Hardy argues that Husserl's phenomenology is compatible with scientific realism. Scientific realism holds that scientific theories provide a true description of the world, while scientific instrumentalism holds that scientific theories are mere devices for predictions about the behavior of things. A crucial question for this debate is the ontological status of unobservable entities, such as the law of universal gravitation. What is it, exactly? The realist would argue that the law of universal gravitation is a description of a hidden structure of the world, while the instrumentalist would argue that it is just a tool for predictions, with no counterpart in reality.

As shown by Hardy, several authors of the contemporary Anglo-American realism/instrumentalism debate have taken Husserl to be an instrumentalist. Thus, they have inferred that Husserl's phenomenology has nothing to offer to a realistic understanding of scientific theories. In addition, they would claim that Husserl is a foundationalist. Foundationalism is, in the philosophical tradition, the understanding of scientific knowledge as a "unified system of deductively interconnected necessary truths derived from self-evident universal and generic principles" (13). Here, Aristotle and Descartes come to mind. This view is hardly compatible with the post-Popperian view of science in contemporary philosophy, according to which the peculiarity of science lies in its openness to self-correction, rather than in an infallible deductive power. So, if Husserl was a foundationalist, isn't his philosophy doomed to an old-fashioned view of science? Husserl's alleged idealism makes things even worse. How could an idealistic philosophy ever offer something to a realistic understanding of scientific theories?

The book has three parts. In the first, Hardy presents his interpretation of the relationship between phenomenology and sciences in Husserl's philosophy. In the second, he aims at showing that Husserl's phenomenology is compatible with a realistic account of science. In the third, he focuses on physics. According to Hardy, Husserl had an instrumentalist interpretation of physical laws but nevertheless took physics to say something about the real world. In the last section of the third part, Hardy argues that Husserl's idealism is fully compatible with the aforementioned realism about hidden entities in natural sciences. Let's take a closer look at the three parts.

In Part One, Hardy works to dispel a widespread misunderstanding about Husserl's account of science. According to him, "Husserl's conception of the structure of scientific theory - both eidetic and empirical - is decisively and exclusively shaped by the classical idea of science" (27), that is, science is a unified system of truths derived from basic and self-evident principles. Hardy shows that Husserl shared the classical ideal of science, but only as far as eidetic disciplines, such as pure logic, are concerned. Empirical sciences have for Husserl a "hypothetical character" (31). According to Hardy, the late Husserl came even to reappraise the status of eidetic sciences (38). The discovery of the temporal structure of consciousness led him to think that, even in eidetic intuitions, the possibility for further correction will be always open, as in empirical sciences.

Hardy then addresses the relation between phenomenology and the sciences in Husserl's philosophy. This relation is threefold (44-5), It reflects a sort of tripartite ontological structure: a) formal ontology, b) material ontology and c) transcendental ontology (transcendental subjectivity). Formal ontology is the realm of logic, which sets the conditions of possibility of a theory in general (49). The identification of primitive concepts for theories is the task of the phenomenologist (55). Material ontology is the realm of the material a priori. Every special science operates in a regional ontology defined by a nexus of generic essences. Phenomenology inquires into the different kinds of essences, and it serves as a foundation for empirical sciences. Transcendental ontology is the domain of transcendental consciousness. Special sciences presuppose the existence of the world. But the fact that the world appears as real has its correlative in the intentional operations of consciousness. Phenomenology tries to understand how the sense of transcendent objects is constituted in consciousness. Phenomenology can thus serve as a grounding science for the empirical sciences.

In Part Two, Hardy argues for the compatibility between phenomenology and a realistic account of scientific theories. Scientific theories often move beyond the observable, and they posit unobservable entities as natural laws. How can phenomenology, with its focus on evidence and intuition, be compatible with such entities, which are hidden in principle (78)?

Hardy then confutes a "crude interpretation" (82) of Husserl's understanding of the relation between truth and evidence. According to the "crude interpretation," a proposition is true if its content is (actually) intuitively given in consciousness. Moreover, a state of affairs subsists only if the corresponding proposition is true. Therefore, a state of affairs subsists only if the content of the corresponding proposition is (actually) intuitively given. If this is what Husserl thinks, Hardy observes, his phenomenology would be a sort of esse est percipi, ruling out the possibility of hidden existing entities. According to Hardy, Husserl's remarks on truth and evidence must be interpreted in another manner: a proposition is true if there is an ideal possibility of intuitive fulfillment for its content. Occurrent cases of evidence will be always fallible, because stronger evidence could refute the previous one. Evidence is a regulative ideal for the formation of beliefs. In discussing truth and evidence Husserl is concerned with a theory of justification of beliefs. Thus, Hardy concludes, in Husserl's phenomenology there is room for truth-claims about entities that are not actually intuitively given.

Hardy goes on to address the relationship between evidence and justification of beliefs. What does it mean, in Husserl's phenomenology, that evidence is valid as a source of justification? In Hardy's view, Husserl provides a "strong" and a "weak" answer (102). According to the strong statement, a position of reality is justified, only if its sense is "actually so fulfilled" (111). This is, in a way, the equivalent of the "crude interpretation", in the domain of justification. However, Hardy claims, such a standard is expected by Husserl only from the phenomenologist (117), who operates with eidetic intuitions. Instead, the scientist can rely on the "weak" statement. According to it, a position of reality is justified, if the object could be adequately given for some possible consciousness. This standard is, in fact, strikingly weak. According to Hardy, Husserl concedes that positive sciences have their own ways to formulate non-actually evident justified beliefs. Philosophical and scientific rationality must not be conflated. At the same time, Hardy convincingly remarks, Husserl does see a necessary link between knowledge and evidence. There is no knowledge without evidence. Claiming that positive sciences have their rationality even without evidence must imply that positive sciences have some other goal than knowledge in the strict sense (124). There is also a component of instrumentalism in Husserl's view of positive sciences. How is it compatible with realism about hidden entities?

In Part Three, Hardy begins by arguing that the late Husserl was a nonstandard instrumentalist. In Ideas I, Husserl thought that physics deals with things given in perception. This could imply that physics deals only with perceptual things, so that there wouldn't be room left for hidden entities. Hardy tries to show a) that the view in Ideas I had intrinsic problems, and b) that it was not Husserl's last word on the subject. In the Crisis, indeed, Husserl thought that physics deals with idealized mathematical objects.

Hardy maintains that Husserl's view about physics in Ideas I is flawed. According to Husserl if the thing of physics exists, it must be in principle perceivable (by some subject in general) (138). For Husserl, being perceivable belongs to the essential structure of transcendent objects: a non-perceivable thing is a contradiction in terms, like a square circle. Hardy sees a problem with this. He claims that the physical sciences deal with the hidden causes of appearances (139), and that this kind of thing is in principle non perceivable. If we postulate the existence of non-perceivable hidden entities, there is no contradiction in terms. However, Hardy overlooks that Husserl is carrying out a transcendental analysis. There is no room for "postulations", because Husserl is precisely trying to account for the possibility of positing transcendent things. Husserl wants to understand which are the intentional correlates of the transcendent thing, and he claims that perception is one of them: the possibility of perception is embedded in the very meaning of "thing" as we constitute it. Therefore, Hardy's critique is not strikingly convincing.

Husserl's identification between the perceivable object and the thing of physics suggests that he takes the determinations of physical sciences to be determinations of perceivable objects. This becomes manifest, according to Hardy, in Husserl's interpretation of geometry in Ideas I. Husserl sees geometry as the eidetic discipline of the region "space." Geometrical objects are essences constituted by an operation of ideation on the concrete spatial individuals. Geometry lays down the essential spatial structure of the material world. However, according to Hardy the later Husserl changed his view (148). In works like the Crisis or Formal and Transcendental Logic, the objects of geometry and mathematics are taken to be ideal individual entities, constituted by an operation of idealization. Ideation and idealization are not the same. Ideation abstracts a universal structure, while idealization variates on real individuals in order to build their ideal counterparts (the variation of real, inexact circles brings to the idealization of the exact circle).

If geometry and mathematics operate by idealization, does it mean that they have no relation to the real world? And, as natural sciences rely on geometry and mathematics, does it mean that they do not have a grasp of the real world? According to Hardy, this is not the case. Geometry and mathematics make knowledge of the real world possible through approximation; the ideal case will be applied to "real cases through a process of 'successive approximation'" (155). This is what happens in physics: at the beginning, physicists sketch a model based on idealization, and then they approximate it gradually to the inexact complexity of reality. Therefore, Husserl's late account of physics is instrumentalist, since in his view its objects are ideal, not real, yet it is compatible with the possibility of truth-claims about the real world, through approximation.

Hardy then faces the most difficult challenge for his account. Wasn't Husserl an idealist? How can idealism be compatible with realism about the hidden entities of physics?

Hardy addresses the most blatant formulations of Husserl's idealism: the existence of things is relative to consciousness, and things are intentional formations of transcendental consciousness. In order to tackle them, Hardy presents some introductory remarks on the meaning of phenomenology in the wake of Aron Gurwitsch. According to Gurwitsch, phenomenology is not a discipline about objects, but rather about our consciousness of objects. Phenomenology does not deal with the existence of objects, but rather with the question of how an object is rationally posited as existing (p.169). Hardy then considers the infamous thought-experiment of the "annihilation of the world." In Ideas I, Husserl argues that, if the world given in experience should turn into a chaos of sensations, consciousness will still be there with its intentional operations. Often this thought-experiment has been taken as an endorsement of the ontological priority of consciousness over the world. Hardy takes it to be just the expression of the "weak claim" (172) that consciousness need not be intentional: "For even if consciousness could exist without presenting physical objects, it does not follow that consciousness does not require a physical substrate for its existence" (172-73).

Hardy is right in claiming that Husserl is interested in understanding how things are given to consciousness. However, he again overlooks the transcendental status of Husserl's analyses: the phenomenological reduction brackets the validity of transcendence as such. If we, as Hardy does, continue admitting the ongoing validity of an alleged "hidden reality," as the "physical substrate" of consciousness, this means that we have carried out only a partial phenomenological reduction. We have not bracketed all the validities, but only some. Of course it is legitimate to do so, but it is highly questionable that this was Husserl's understanding of phenomenology. For Husserl, each position of reality is parasitic on our experience. Reality is precisely what is given or could be given in our experience according to certain normative standards. There is no other meaning of the word "reality." Assuming that the whole world in our experience could turn into chaos, while at the same time having a "physical substrate" at the base of consciousness, is very far from Husserl. In his view, the expression "physical substrate" would simply have no reference here. Assuming, as Hardy does, that for Husserl "existence is existence for us," (174) this would be a naturalistic understanding of phenomenology. But Hardy should be more cautious in attributing it to the old master.

Hardy further develops his interpretation, relating it to the debate about the status of the noema. Unsurprisingly he is a follower of the so-called "West coast interpretation," according to which the noema is an intermediate entity between consciousness and its objects. In this section Hardy has no particularly original contribution. In the conclusion, Hardy summarizes his whole argument and he addresses some critiques.

Hardy's book has many merits. His argument is lucid, relates to many ongoing debates about science and realism, and offers a jargon-free explanation of many important Husserlian concepts. Hardy's main claim, that phenomenology is compatible with realism, is also convincing, and his argument for the claim is well constructed. Phenomenologists will appreciate the abundant text materials in the endnotes -- almost a book in themselves.

However, one may ask if Hardy's strategy is the only possible or the most convincing one. Obviously, this is related to how one understands phenomenology. In The Idea of Phenomenology Husserl draws a crucial distinction between psychologic and transcendental immanence: psychologic immanence is what is given in consciousness as its content, while transcendental immanence is what is given in an adequate way. This distinction does not play any role in Hardy's book. Hardy seems to think that Husserl's phenomenology refers to (a very broad version of) psychological immanence, compatible with the existence of a world outside it. So the enigma of transcendence is not solved, but only postponed. How do we ever come to posit or postulate such a "world outside"? Outside of what? Husserl's project, and peculiar realism, aims precisely at showing that "reality" is something constituted in our experience, and there is no other meaning to it.