Nature, the Artful Modeler: Lectures on Laws, Science, How Nature Arranges the World and How We Can Arrange It Better

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Nancy Cartwright, Nature, the Artful Modeler: Lectures on Laws, Science, How Nature Arranges the World and How We Can Arrange It Better, Open Court, 2019, 159pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780812694680.

Reviewed by Eric Winsberg, The University of South Florida


The 1980s were a golden age for philosophy of science. A small number of incredibly influential philosophers released monographs that set the agenda for many of what are now the main topics in the field. But none quite so single-handedly created a subdiscipline in the philosophy of science as did Nancy Cartwright with her How the Laws of Physics Lie (1983).

The book had both a narrow and a wider thesis. The narrow thesis was that scientific laws failed to play the role that most philosophers of science had taken for granted: "Rendered as descriptions of fact, they are false; amended to be true, they lose their fundamental explanatory force" (1983, p. 54). The wider thesis was that philosophers inadequately appreciated the role that models play in science -- laws are not only ends in themselves, but tools for building models; in most scientific contexts, models do most of the heavy lifting in giving us representations of what the world is like.

To many Cartwrightians, this was primarily a pragmatic point. The world is simply too complex and messy for laws and theories to get purchase on it directly. Models, with their "lies" about how the world is, are needed to help us unlock the representational and explanatory power of laws. Theories are not just "vending machines" that easily dispense representational models of the world. This reading of Cartwright has been the most influential -- and is the one primarily responsible for creating a Cartwrightian school in philosophy of science concerned with the central role of modeling in the sciences. There would be no philosophy of computer simulation or philosophy of climate science without Cartwright's trailblazing work.

But Cartwright's picture was never intended to be merely practical. You might think it is just limited epistemic agents who can't treat theories as vending machines -- that the world layers together too many laws, at too many scales, for us to unpack everything that emerges from the complex non-linear interactions of all these effects. Not so Cartwright. In "Nature's Methods Are Our Methods," the first essay of the present book, she makes clear that the world itself only instantiates its laws and theories haphazardly. The world is an archipelago of islands, on each of which some of the laws apply, amid a sea of chaos. The various laws (those that others would call 'fundamental', as well as the 'higher level laws') simply apply where and when they do. And Cartwright brooks no appeals to supervenience. Where the "higher level" laws apply, they do so autonomously of the "lower level" ones. How could this be? Why does all this autonomy not lead, as it often does with autonomous states, to conflict?

Cartwright once told two stories of how God could

write the Book of Nature [so as] to guarantee consistency. In the first story . . . He carefully writes out all of its laws and lays down the initial positions and velocities of all the atoms in the universe. He then leaves to Saint Peter the tedious . . . job of calculating all future happenings . . . [In the second] God is instead very concerned about laws, and so he writes down each and every regularity that his universe will display . . . . Saint Peter is left with the gargantuan task of arranging the initial properties in the universe in some way that will allow all God's laws to be true together. (1999, p. 33)

In the present book, Saint Peter has been replaced by Nature, whose job description has reached its logical conclusion: nature-as-engineer. A builder of devices. Interestingly, this locates Cartwright in long tradition, from early Hermetic Mystics like John Dee, to Christian Wolff.

Art often reduces secret historical knowledge to common historical knowledge. The operations of art and also experience often bring to light facts of nature which otherwise would be hidden. Hence it makes no difference to the knower whether nature presents things to the senses or whether art provides the senses with things which otherwise would escape their notice. (Wolff, 1963 [1728], p. 13)

As Frederick Beiser puts it, Wolff think the arts "show us the inner workings of nature because they produce things by employing the same creative powers as nature herself" (Beiser, 2009, p. 54).

Finding no evidence in science for supervenience, Cartwright sees Nature-as-engineer as the only other possible explanation for how scientific experiments work, and indeed for the very fact that "Nomological machines" -- the islands in the archipelago where the laws hold -- can be created in the laboratory. Her main argument, grounded in a reconstruction of Robert Millikan's oil drop experiment, is that only a dogmatic commitment to supervenience, or else her own view of nature, can explain Millikan's success. The oil drop example also illustrates that Cartwright's nature does not build her nomological machines "by the book" (p. 9). She is not merely an artist, she is an Artful Modeler: employing all the tricks and contrivances that engineers and successful experimentalists are famous for -- a combination of idealizations and of shielding techniques that make the idealizations work (more on this later).

Cartwright wants to insist, above all, on two things.

  1. "I urge firm empiricism: short steps from what we see to what we claim there is, not . . . great leaps of faith." (p. 23)
  2. "I am not defending instrumentalism . . . Nothing in my argument blocks us from having genuine knowledge." (p. 20)

Such strict empiricism and scientific realism are strange bedfellows. Cartwright bridges the gap using Wolff's metaphor: the artful modeler can know the world on its own terms because she follows nature in her footsteps -- it makes no difference "whether nature presents things to the senses or whether art provides the senses with things which otherwise would escape their notice".

If Cartwright's motto in the first essay is 'Nature brooks no supervenience,' her motto in the second is 'and no vector addition either.' More precisely: "Vector addition is not addition; it is not mereology; is not the glomming together of parts" (p. 32). Her skepticism about vector addition led her to the ontology of "capacities" (now "powers"), in Nature's Capacities and their Measurement. While I am never sure where I come down on Cartwright's skepticism of supervenience, I have certainly always admired her dogged empiricism that resisted it -- that mocked it as grounded more in faith than reason. I confess that I've never quite understood her aversion to a mereological conception of vector addition (MVA) as clearly as her aversion to supervenience. If I drive in a big circle and end up back at home, does each leg of my trip not count as a part of the whole trip because I didn't end up 100 miles away from home?

MVA plays an exactly analogous argumentative role in the second essay, "Nature's Raw Materials," as supervenience did in the first. Without MVA, only an "Aristotelian" picture of the world (in the form of her "Trias Powers Ontology") explains such diverse features of scientific practice as the "analytic method," our treatments of probabilistic causes, and the post hoc evaluation of policy effectiveness.

Not only do I find the underlying motivation less compelling here than in essay one, the argumentative structure is somewhat less clear as well. The conclusion, in any case, is that the picture of capacities that Cartwright herself presented in Nature's Capacities was flawed. It was overly realist about the principles that articulate the powers at work in an analysis of Millikan's apparatus -- the principles that tell you what the features of the experiment (gravity, charge, drag) "contribute" to the force on the oil drop. No longer does Cartwright think it is correct to say that it is a true principle that gravity's power contributes  to the force that will move the oil drop. Gravity's power to act first obtains, but it also separately has to exercise its power, and then finally, as a yet separate matter, the outcome of the exercise of that power has to obtain. The end picture is rather homuncular, and one wonders whether, like homuncular explanations, it could be forced to be endlessly subdivided under scrutiny.

In "Nature's Limits" we come full circle: back to the practical. This is where Cartwright brings her metaphysical picture to bear on what is one of the most pressing problems on which philosophers of science could focus their attention: how philosophers can help policy makers make better use of scientific knowledge. Cartwright is in search of the best philosophical account of how we ought to assess the prospects of real-world intervention strategies. She is concerned with such questions as "Will a pre-exposure prophylaxis pill reduce HIV infection rates in Kenya?" and "Will the adoption of a training program in a school help to reduce poverty among its graduates?" But her work is also directly relevant to a question I think about more every day, "What interventions are most likely to protect the world from dangerous climate change?"

Her goal here is to contrast and evaluate two different strategies for identifying and evaluating possible causal interventions that will bring about desired effects.

The intervention-centered hopes to do so by identifying some causes that can generally be relied on to produce those effects across different contexts. The context-centered, by identifying what causal pathways to the effect are locally possible (p. 58).

The first approach is quite clear. It is grounded in randomized controlled trials (RCTs). RCTs give you very reliable information about the connection between an intervention and an outcome in a particular population. Often, though, we want to know something about what interventions will work in a population different from the one we have sampled. This is especially hard in the wild where, as Cartwright explains, interventions are directed at the "Long View," where causes bring about their effects through a variety of intermediate stages, or "mediator variables." Like in a Rube Goldberg machine. Whether an intervention that works on one Rube Goldberg machine will work on another depends on many details of each machine.

Cartwright argues that whether we can successfully determine whether the information acquired in an RCT will work in a new setting depends on the availability of reliable "markers" that a causal claim will work in a new setting, and "cautions" that they will not. One of her most astute observations here is that researchers who conduct RCTs are frequently cautioned to be explicit in reporting the inclusion and exclusion criteria of their studies when they report their results. There is a superficial similarity, she warns, between inclusion and exclusion criteria and markers and cautions. Prima facie, inclusion criteria are markers and exclusion criteria are cautions. They seem to say 'Be cautious of my RCT if your population contains many individuals who would have been excluded from my trial.' Cartwright argues cogently, though, that "Trial population selection criteria give little clue to applicability" (p. 71).

What about the alternative? This is what Cartwright calls the "context-centered approach." Unfortunately, the details here are a little thin. The entire section that explains her preferred approach is less than three pages long (p. 73-75, with more details in Cartwright and Hardie, 2012). Much of this comprises going back over the oil drop example in the service of giving the ordinary advice to pay attention to details, pay attention to context, and watch carefully for things that can go wrong. But she does offer one tantalizing nugget:

It takes know-how. It cannot be done by the book; it takes art. That's the sticking point in the evidence-based policy movement. They don't like art. They don't trust techné; they want episteme; and above all they want a book. (p. 75)

I am reluctant to endorse a natural reading of this claim. This is the reading according to which the tacit knowledge of experts with track records of success should be trusted, even when they have no 'book' to follow that is supported by publicly evaluable evidence. We should accept all the cautions about extrapolating RCTs beyond their domain of applicability without having to resign ourselves to trusting the tacit knowledge of experts. And unfortunately, it is hard to make out a clear alternative reading in Cartwright. But there is a better conception of what it is to apply techné -- one that shows scientific modeling and artful modeling to be quite a bit further apart than she recognizes.

One important difference between science and 'art' (or what we now mostly call engineering) is that science mostly aims at prediction and explanation, whereas engineering mostly aims at design and control. Indeed much of engineering involves "control theory." It is a central dogma of control theory that in engineering, one often operates under uncertainty about the model of the object one desires to build, or of details regarding the environment in which it operates. The chief strategy is to use feedback -- either in the form of a direct mechanism, or of sensors directing calculated adjustments, in order to correct for deviations from the desired behavior. The paradigmatic implementation of control theory is the centrifugal governor -- but think also of the electronic cruise control system on a car. The latter does not rely on a prediction regarding how much gas will need to be delivered to the fuel injectors over the course of a mile travelled.

Indeed control theory is the strategy par excellence for dealing with what Cartwright calls the "Long View problem." Watch someone build a Rube Goldberg machine from scratch and you will see control theory in action -- as the builder, for example, adjusts the heat setting on the iron in response to observing that it does not generate enough smoke to chase out the opossum (cf. Cartwright and Hardie, 2012, p. 77).

What does this have to do with guiding policy? I'll stick with a topic I have thought about more than epidemiology, job training, or ecosystem protection: the mitigation of, and adaptation to, dangerous climate change. Consider first climate change mitigation. The pace and direction of technological innovation is nearly impossible to predict. Nearly as hard is predicting the response to regulatory structures, tax incentives and disincentives, and the like. Finally, few people would have predicted that the models of international cooperation that worked so well in the Montreal protocol (for CFCs) would fail so miserably in Kyoto. Good climate policy needs to be responsive and adaptive. Policy makers should be seeking expert guidance on how to proceed, but also keenly aware that vast uncertainties exist in all of these domains. And they must be ready and willing to monitor their effects and respond accordingly. It also means they should be wary of policy proposals that are likely to be "sticky," because of, for example, regulatory capture or other similar effects. This does not entail that policy moves have to be "incremental" in the politically centrist sense, but it does mean, for example, that Manhattan-project-esque proposals for developing technologies might not be the best idea. Better to pursue a large variety of energy-technology-development strategies and keep your powder dry for boosting, like a good control theorist, the ones that are appearing most promising as the Long View unfolds.

In climate adaptation, control theory should be the name of the game in almost every venture. Climate projections at the regional scale and below (the relevant scale of almost any possible adaptation measure) will remain fraught with uncertainty for at least the remainder of all of our natural lifespans. And so adaptation measures, if they are to be at all successful, will need to involve sophisticated feedbacks between their carefully measured effects and subsequent adjustments.

If policy generation is techné and not episteme, techné as intrinsically involving control theory is the most useful way to understand the difference.

I have covered only the three main essays of the book. There are four others, three of which have appeared elsewhere. These comprise two essays in which Cartwright defends the claim that possibilities are real, one on the compatibility of scientific laws with contingency, and a final essay on the ways in which different conceptions of causality support different loci for blame and responsibility.

The book is a must read for those interested in the philosophy, politics, and economics of scientific decision support, and for those interested in the metaphysics of laws of nature. It is also a must read for all students of model-based philosophy of science. It displays all of the philosophical traits that have made Cartwright a force of nature in philosophy of science for the last four decades: provocative, fierce, and fearless while also inspiring -- leaving wonderful bread crumbs everywhere for people to follow. It is a must read for anyone interested in how the world works and how we can make it better. Some are bound to find it frustratingly short on argumentative detail in places, but they will be rightly compensated if they know where to look in other parts of Cartwright's oeuvre.


Beiser, F. C. [2009]: Diotima's children: German aesthetic rationalism from Leibniz to Lessing, Oxford University Press.

Cartwright, N. [1983]: How the Laws of Physics Lie, Oxford University Press.

Cartwright, N. [1989]: Nature's Capacities and Their Measurement, Oxford University Press.

Cartwright, N. [1999]: The dappled world: A study of the boundaries of science, Cambridge University Press.

Cartwright, N. and Hardie, J. [2012]: Evidence-based policy: A practical guide to doing it better, Oxford University Press.

Wolff, C. F. v. [1963[1728]]: Preliminary Discourse on Philosophy in General, Translated, With an Introd. and Notes, by Richard J. Blackwell, Bobbs-Merrill.