Necessary Beings: An Essay on Ontology, Modality, and the Relations Between Them

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Bob Hale, Necessary Beings: An Essay on Ontology, Modality, and the Relations Between Them, Oxford University Press, 2013, 298pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199669578.

Reviewed by Penelope Mackie, University of Nottingham


In this important new book, Bob Hale presents a distinctive theory of the relations between ontology and modality, and develops an original "essentialist theory" of metaphysical modality. Although several chapters draw on Hale's previously published work, the modest hope that he expresses in the Introduction, "that both the picture as a whole and some of its elements differ significantly enough from any other published treatments . . . to make it worth presenting" (p. 1) is amply justified. The book will appeal both to those who are, and to those who are not, familiar with Hale's previous writings on ontology and modality.

Chapter 1 ("Ontological Preliminaries") defends a broadly Fregean approach to ontology, according to which ontological categories (such as those of object and property) are to be explained in terms of a prior logical categorization of expressions (such as singular term and predicate). In a significant departure from Frege's own views, however, Hale advocates (in response to Frege's notorious problem of the concept horse) a view according to which properties can be referred to by both predicates and singular terms (pp. 31-32). One consequence of Hale's ontological theory is that the categories of object and property, and the conditions for the existence of things belonging to these categories, must be characterized partly in modal terms (pp. 20, 36-40, 63).

The next three chapters are concerned with fundamental questions about the status of modality. In Chapter 2, Hale maintains -- building on arguments by Ian McFetridge and Crispin Wright -- that we must accept that there are at least some genuine modal facts (specifically, some logical necessities). In Chapter 3, he defends what might be described as a form of non-reductive realism about modality -- arguing against the possibility of a satisfactory reduction of modality to possible worlds, against there being any interesting supervenience of modality on non-modal facts, and against a "dilemma" argument in favour of non-cognitivism about modality proposed by Simon Blackburn. In the course of this discussion, Hale introduces the notion of an "absolute necessity" -- roughly, a necessity that holds "come what may" (p. 47), attributing this status to the logical necessities for whose indispensability he argues in Chapter 2. Chapter 4 provides a detailed discussion of the notion of absolute necessity, concluding with an account of the relation between logical and metaphysical modality according to which logical necessities are a subclass of metaphysical necessities, and there may be metaphysical but non-logical necessities that are absolute necessities (§4.5).

In Chapter 5, Hale turns to the question of the source or basis of necessity, and, in particular, of absolute necessity (p. 116). Five of the remaining chapters of the book (Chs. 5, 6, 7, 9, and 11) are devoted to expounding, developing, and defending Hale's distinctive "essentialist theory" of metaphysical necessity.

The theory is introduced in connection with logical necessity (Ch. 5), where it is argued that logical necessities have their source, not in conventions or meanings, but in the nature of certain logical entities (such as conjunction and universal quantification). Having established this result, Hale argues (Ch. 6) that the form of the account can be extended to metaphysical necessities whose source is (either wholly or partly) in the nature of non-logical entities. This offers the prospect of a general theory of metaphysical necessity as having its source in what is true in virtue of the natures (or essences) of relevant entities, where the general form of explanation is "It is necessary that p because it is true in virtue of the natures of X1, . . . , Xn that p" (p. 145). Since, according to Hale, "Everything has a nature, no matter what kind of thing it is" (p. 151; cf. pp. 147, 255), there appears to be the potential for the extension of the theory to a very wide range of metaphysical necessities indeed. The idea of explaining necessities by reference to natures or essences is, of course, familiar from the work of Kit Fine, especially his highly influential "Essence and Modality". Hale claims, however, that his project differs from Fine's in certain respects, notably the fact that, unlike Fine, he does not aim to provide a reduction of modality to essence or nature (p. 150, n. 12; also p. 134, n. 27). Hale is well aware that his claim that we can explain a necessity by invoking a nature or essence might be challenged in a variety of ways. Accordingly, substantial portions of Chapters 5 and 6 are devoted to defending the explanatory credentials of the account (§§5.5, 6.4, and 6.6).

One question Hale raises about the scope and adequacy of the essentialist theory is whether it can account for all absolute necessities (pp. 157, 165). According to Hale, an affirmative answer requires that there be some necessary existents: in particular, certain necessarily existent natures, and -- if the truths of arithmetic, taken at face value, are to be absolutely necessary -- the necessary existence of the natural numbers (p. 165; cf. p. 5). In Chapter 7 Hale argues, partly by appeal to the conclusions of Chapter 1, that these demands can be met.

Arguably, though, it is not the need to accommodate the necessary existence of some objects and natures, but rather the apparent need to accommodate the contingent existence of some objects and natures that poses the greater challenge to Hale's theory. Hale is reluctant to reject the common-sense views that there are objects whose existence is contingent and that there could have been objects that do not actually exist (p. 206), and he doubts that all natures are necessary existents (pp. 221-23). He devotes a chapter (Ch. 9) to arguing that the complications that these concessions pose for his essentialist theory are not fatal.

In Chapter 11, the final chapter of the book, Hale turns to the question whether the essentialist theory can provide an adequate account of modal knowledge: specifically, of our knowledge of natures or essences. He argues for an affirmative answer, according to which some of the relevant knowledge of nature or essence is a priori (principally based on knowledge of meanings (§11.2)), and some a posteriori. In the case of the latter, the account invokes the inferential model of knowledge of a posteriori necessities (as based partly on a priori knowledge of general essentialist principles) familiar from Kripke's Naming and Necessity. Although Hale is relatively non-committal about which general essentialist principles we should accept (p. 269), he endorses, inter alia, the necessity of identity (§11.3.2) and the principle that every object belongs essentially to some sortal kind (§11.3.5). He is also sympathetic to some version of a necessity of origin thesis (§11.3.7) and to Kripke's claims about the necessity of certain theoretical identifications, such as the identity of water with H2O (§11.3.8).

The two remaining chapters appear to be largely independent of the main argument of the later part of the book, although both exploit the account of properties developed in Chapter 1. In Chapter 8 ("Higher-order Logics") Hale employs his conception of properties to respond to Quine's charge that higher-order logic is "set theory in sheep's clothing". In Chapter 10 ("Possibilities") Hale argues for a modal semantics according to which the place of possible worlds, thought of as maximal or complete possibilities, is taken by possibilities conceived of as "typically indeterminate or incomplete ways things could be" (p. 6).

As my summary indicates, this is an extraordinarily rich and wide-ranging discussion. It is therefore worth pointing out that, in spite of the interconnections between its topics, substantial portions of the book could profitably be studied in comparative isolation from one another. This includes the portion that expounds and defends Hale's distinctive essentialist theory of metaphysical modality, and which is, I think, likely to attract the most attention and critical discussion.

One fundamental question about the essentialist theory is why we should be attracted to the idea that metaphysical necessities are grounded in natures or essences. In recommending the theory, Hale does not appear to make much of the fact, emphasized by Fine in his "Essence and Modality", that the essence-based theory allows us to discriminate, among the necessary truths about a given object x, between those that are true in virtue of the nature of x, and those that are true in virtue of the natures of objects other than x. Hale does, however, highlight two other explanatory considerations. First (as is also suggested by Fine), the essentialist theory offers the prospect of a unified account of metaphysical necessities (pp. 144, 147, 117). Secondly, Hale argues that the theory can provide an explanation of the "source of necessity" -- i.e., of why there are any necessities at all -- that is consistent with the principle, endorsed by Hale, that (at least for absolute necessities) anything that explains a necessity must itself be necessary (p. 131). Hale's defence of the second of these claims makes crucial appeal to the possibility, which he has defended in previous work, of a "non-transmissive" explanation of a necessity: an explanation of the form "Necessarily p, because q" in which "the explanans, q, is indeed necessary . . . but . . . what explains the necessity of the explanandum is not q's necessity, but its truth simpliciter" (p. 131; cf. p. 96). According to Hale, explanations of necessities in terms of natures or essences may take this form. The fact that it is necessary that p may be explained by the fact (q) that it is true in virtue of the nature of some entity X that p, where, although q is necessary, it is the plain fact that q, and not its necessity, to which the explanation appeals.

It is a fascinating question whether Hale is warranted in claiming this explanatory advantage for his theory. Although I cannot do justice to the issues here, I am not certain that, in spite of his careful and subtle discussion of objections (in §§5.5, 6.4, and 6.6), Hale has succeeded in dispelling all legitimate doubts. In particular, I wonder whether he has given an adequate response to the worry that a claim about what is true in virtue of a thing's nature is really a disguised claim that something is necessary, and hence that an explanation of a necessity by reference to what is true in virtue of something's nature is not genuinely non-transmissive (pp. 134-36). Be that as it may, as far as I can see, Hale's essentialist theory would retain much of its interest even if it were combined with the view that all explanations of necessity must be transmissive, especially as Hale holds that there are some basic necessities whose necessity cannot be explained at all (p. 158).

There is, however, one aspect of Hale's theory, as it stands, that seems to me seriously problematic, and at least to require its modification. Hale holds that a thing's nature or essence is a property that "makes it the thing it is, and distinguishes it from every other thing" and which belongs to it necessarily (pp. 132-33); also that everything has such a unique nature or essence (e.g., p. 151). Further, according to Hale, a thing's individual nature or essence is not a primitive haecceity or "thisness", but a property that provides an informative answer to the question what makes it the particular individual that it is (p. 222, n. 27). Hale thus commits himself to the thesis that everything has what we may call a substantial individual essence. But this commitment is, I think, unsustainable (unless, that is, one is willing to adopt a radically revisionary account -- of which the theory associated with Leibniz is an extreme version -- according to which many properties that intuition firmly classifies as accidental turn out to be essential). It is at least doubtful that, in the forty years since the publication of Kripke's Naming and Necessity, anyone has succeeded in providing, for ordinary concrete objects, satisfactory candidates for substantial individual essences even in what might seem to be the most favourable cases -- human beings and other biological organisms -- let alone for other cases, including artefacts. Moreover, there is a principled reason for the failure. An ordinary concrete object simply does not appear to possess any suitable (i.e., non-haecceitistic) property -- even an origin property -- that is strictly "unshareable", in the sense that it cannot be possessed by two objects within any possible world, and yet is also plausibly regarded as an essential property. (It is worth noting that Hale's argument that it is essential to a particular frog to come from the particular fertilized egg from which it actually came (p. 278), even if accepted, is of no help here -- nor, I should say, does Hale suggest otherwise. For Hale's argument relies on the assumption that the relation between the frog and the egg is identity. And being identical with fertilized egg E is not a candidate for a substantial individual essence.)

Could Hale's essentialist theory survive the abandonment of his thesis that everything has its own unique and substantial essence or nature? Although it would require significant modification to its details as presented in this book, I see no obvious reason why the theory could not be freed from this commitment. For example, I don't see why there should not be necessary truths about Aristotle that are true in virtue of his nature, even if Aristotle's nature is not a substantial individual essence, and even, perhaps, if Aristotle's nature simply consists in, say, being a man (cf. p. 223). Moreover, dropping the thesis that everything has its own unique substantial nature might free Hale from the pressure to allow for individual natures that are contingent existents (pp. 222-23). This would, I think, be a welcome result, since the concession is something of an embarrassment for Hale's theory (Ch. 9, pp. 218-27), especially as he appears to be committed, by his own principles, to the view that what is true in virtue of a contingently existent nature cannot be absolutely necessary.

In this brief discussion, I have only scratched the surface of a few of the interesting and controversial issues raised by Hale's theory of metaphysical modality. I hope I have said enough, though, to indicate that the essentialist theory presented in this book constitutes a significant contribution to an exciting research project concerning the relations between modality and essence. In addition, of course, Hale's development of the essentialist theory is only one aspect of the book's important contribution to central and fundamental topics concerning the nature of modality.

Not surprisingly, given the sheer volume of material in the book, there are some errors in cross-references (mostly between footnotes), although I noticed no serious typographical errors. In spite of the fact that this has no bearing on the philosophical worth of the book, I can't resist a comment on some eccentric aspects of the formatting. There is a frequent lack of adequate spaces after punctuation marks (especially full stops), and significant variation in the spacing of the words and letters in the text, sometimes even on the same page. In this respect, the formatting seems to me to fall short of the aesthetic standards that one would expect of a prestigious academic press. I was, however, profoundly grateful for the fact that the (copious) notes are printed as footnotes rather than as endnotes, and as a result can easily be read in conjunction with the main text.


 Thanks to Robert Frazier for helpful discussion of many of the topics of this review.