Necessary Intentionality: A Study in the Metaphysics of Aboutness

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Ori Simchen, Necessary Intentionality: A Study in the Metaphysics of Aboutness, Oxford University Press, 2012, 175pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199608515.

Reviewed by Heimer Geirsson, Iowa State University


The relations between our cognitions and what they are about have been much discussed in recent decades. A popular view used to be that the relation between a cognitive state and what it is about is a contingent affair, namely that my cognitive state might have been just as it actually is in the absence of the object it is of, or in the presence of a qualitatively identical object as the one it is of. A second position, one more in vogue now, is that we can distinguish between a wide and a narrow content, where the wide content is dependent on the object it is of while the narrow content is not. Ori Simchen rejects both of these views. Instead, he argues, there is a necessary connection between a cognitive episode and the object it is of. There are no narrow contents. Further, a name is necessarily of the object it names. There are natural kinds and individuals have essences that restrain the way they might be. Necessities abound.

The focus of Necessary Intentionality is on the metaphysics of beliefs, and not belief reports. Nevertheless, one would expect that the light shed on the metaphysics of beliefs would inform a semantic account of beliefs and their reports. Simchen certainly seems to suggest that some avenues are viable while others are not, but he does not provide many insights into the semantic issues that one might expect benefit from the metaphysical exercise.

The book is divided into two parts. The first part deals with modality and the second part with intentionality. The part on modality contains two chapters, the first dealing with particular possibilities and the second with general possibilities. The second part contains three chapters dealing with the intentionality of words, epistemology factualized, and cognitive states as being relational.

In the first part of the book Simchen argues that possibilities pertaining to particular things are basic and explanatorily prior to general possibilities. All real possibilities reduce to possibilities pertaining to particular things, or de re possibilities. The view traces back to the twelfth-century doctrine of Peter Abelard, according to which genuine possibility of a thing issues from the nature, or essence of that thing. For a-ing to be possible for object x is for a-ing not to be repugnant to x's nature. While Simchen does not say much about how we uncover an object's nature, he does provide a general diagnosis of how we are often intuitively drawn to modal errors. We tend to make modal mistakes about how objects might be because we tend to mistake our cognitive means of getting at a given subject matter for the subject matter itself. For example, we are inclined to think that, when stick S was used to fix the reference of 'one meter', stick S must have been one meter long at t0, the time at which S was used as a standard for the meter. The mistake, according to Simchen, is due to the following: first we think that the issue we are dealing with is whether S qua being a standard for the meter at t0 is necessarily one meter long at t0. Then we let S fall out, letting the matter be decided by the generality that it is necessary that to be a standard for the meter at t is to be one meter long at that time.

The second chapter argues that there are far fewer possibilities than we thought there were. General possibilities are secondary to particular possibilities, and particular possibilities depend on individual objects and their natures. Add to this that there are no non-actual things, only actual ones, and possibilities, according to Simchen, become constrained. So, might there have been talking donkeys? Simchen's answer is no. First, the nature of donkeys is such that they do not talk. Second, nothing in the past could have engendered a talking donkey, and so there is no sense at all, Simchen claims, in which there might have been talking donkeys.

Unfortunately Simchen does not directly address some of the more interesting and controversial thought experiments that philosophers are employing in, for example, the philosophy of mind. What about, for example, zombies? Are they possible? Simchen, presumably, would argue that if zombies were possible, then something would be a possible zombie. But nothing is a possible zombie, for if 'zombie' is a putative kind term then to be a possible zombie cannot be had contingently. So, if anything were a possible zombie, then it would already be a zombie. But, since there are no zombies, it is not possible that there be zombies. (Compare, for example, Simchen's argument regarding the possibility of there being unicorns, p. 35). But surely, the issue of the possibility of there being zombies cannot be settled this easily.

Part two of Simchen's book builds on the results of the discussion of modality. As in the first part of the book we find necessities in abundance. For example, in chapter three Simchen argues that referring tokens of nouns, that is names, are necessarily about what they are about. That is not to say that the referring token of the name 'Simchen' had to be tied to Simchen. However, once the referential intention to use that name to refer to Simchen was established, the (token of that) name necessarily refers to him.

A name bears a proper causal-historical connection to the object it is a name of, and a proper referential intention is to employ the name for a particular thing. This, naturally, runs into some difficulties when it comes to names such as 'Vulcan', namely empty names. Simchen's way of dealing with terms such as 'Vulcan' is to claim that, first, the name refers to nothing at all, and second, that the profile of cognitive attitudes involved with the name do not include a referential intention. This last claim is worrisome. Not only does it seem to be false, as many who might not be well informed have normal referential intentions when they use terms such as 'Santa Claus', even though the term refers to nothing. But secondly, there has been a fairly extensive recent discussion on the nature of empty names. The discussion often treats literary names, fictional names, and mythical names differently, assigning different metaphysical status to the various entities. Again, Simchen has a chance to enter a more current debate, or at least show awareness of it, but does not do so. Entering the discussion would of course entail dealing with the various semantic and cognitive puzzles that arise in connection with empty names, but I would think that it would be a test of the metaphysical underpinnings that Simchen is working on how the semantics work out. At least, the metasemantics that Simchen develops should help provide reasonable solutions to such problems.

Chapter four, 'Epistemology factualized', continues looking at the cognitive picture that underlies our epistemic judgments. The discussion centers on Kripke's efforts to explain away our intuitions of contingency regarding various necessities, such as our intuition that many identity statements seem intuitively contingent while they are necessarily true. The necessities of Hesperus being Phosphorus, water being H2O, and the lectern in front of me being made of wood, for example, carry with them an appearance of contingency.

Kripke, famously, suggested that, with regard to, for example, the lectern in front of him, I could have been in the same epistemological situation, or in qualitatively the same epistemic situation that in fact obtains about a table that was made of ice. Simchen rightly points out that if the same epistemological situation includes our causal-historic terms, that is referring tokens that have causal-historic connections to what they refer to, then we cannot be in the same epistemological situation with a different desk. He further argues that given how names gain their meanings, they could not become endowed with narrow content. Consequently, there is no content associated with 'this table' that could sustain the idea that it is epistemically possible that the lectern be made of ice. Similarly, there is no content associated with 'Hesperus' and 'Phosphorus' that can sustain the idea that it is epistemically possible that Hesperus is not Phosphorus.

I do have some concerns with Simchen's discussion of the examples above. However one is to understand Kripke's claims about being in the same epistemological situation and being qualitatively in the same epistemological situation, one should not assume that he suddenly forgot that the names he was working with are rigid designators that refer to the same objects in all possible worlds (in which they exist). Perhaps his idea is as follows. Prior to finding out that Hesperus is Phosphorus it was consistent with all the evidence we had (coherently conceivable) that they were two planets. However, once we found out that they are in fact the same planet the metaphysical possibility that they are different is closed off. We realize that it is not metaphysically possible that they are two planets. So, it appears to me that Simchen has a friend in Kripke as the two of them seem to be largely in an agreement that we need to pry apart conceivability and metaphysical possibility. The real target that Simchen should focus on here seems to be Chalmers with his notion that epistemic possibilities can be a guide to metaphysical possibilities.

The last chapter discusses the relational character of cognitive states, including the de re/de dicto distinction. The distinction is marked in terms of de re attitudes bearing a causal-historical relation between subject and object. As often is the case, however, the specifics of the connection is left too open. That connection is satisfied if I come upon a footprint of a lion that I then want to hunt. Is it similarly satisfied in virtue of me acquiring a name of an object? For example, can I have a de re attitude towards Napoleon in virtue of acquiring his name, the name 'Napoleon' bearing a causal-historical relation to said person? Perhaps some of these questions could have been answered had Simchen ventured more into semantics that then would be underpinned by his metasemantic discussion. For example, does his metasemantic discussion commit him to singular propositions, or something of similar ilk, that contains the object referred to? Perhaps these propositions would grant us access to objects and so help explain how the relevant causal-historic relation obtains.

Overall I have mixed feelings about the book. During times when individual essences, or natures, as well as natural kinds have come under attack, Simchen assumes both exist. While one cannot expect a full-fledged defense of the existence of essences and natural kinds, some discussion that places these in context together with a rationale for basing the work on these is in order. Also, I expected to see some kind of semantic payoff from the metaphysics of beliefs and the metasemantic theory advanced. Finally, as mentioned, there are numerous chances to get engaged with current debates or at least discuss how the view being developed could influence and shed light on various issues and Simchen does not take advantage of these chances.

Simchen's book is certainly interesting. However, I think it could have been much more interesting had he engaged more with current debates and suggested a semantic framework based on his metasemantic views. Also, it would have been helpful to have more examples and explanations throughout the book. The book is clearly too advanced for undergraduate students. Advanced graduate students as well as professionals working in metaphysics and philosophy of language would benefit most from the work.