Necessity and Possibility: The Logical Strategy of Kant's Critique of Pure Reason

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Kurt Mosser, Necessity and Possibility: The Logical Strategy of Kant's Critique of Pure Reason, Catholic University of America Press, 2008, 226pp., $64.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780813215327.

Reviewed by Katherine Dunlop, Brown University


This book contends that at the heart of Kant's Critique of Pure Reason lies a conception of logic which remains relevant in the contemporary setting. In the first of its six chapters, Mosser argues that Kant's conception of logic cannot be isolated from his "Copernican turn". The second and third chapters provide rich and stimulating discussion of early modern views of logic. The fourth chapter treats the "Metaphysical Deduction" of the Critique, where Kant introduces the discipline of "transcendental" logic as the analogue to "general" logic familiar from textbooks and as the arena in which the use of the understanding's pure concepts is to be justified. The fifth chapter draws implications from Kant's view for those of contemporary figures ranging from Michel Foucault to the epistemologist Laurence BonJour. In the sixth chapter, Mosser compares Kant to Wittgenstein. While focusing on issues of Kant interpretation, I will suggest that a more precise specification of the rules that constitute Kant's logic would sharpen the case for his continuing relevance.

Mosser makes clear that the notion of a formal system is alien to Kant's thinking. Contemporary readers thus need another way to understand what distinguishes the concerns of logic. On the first pages of the Preface and Introduction (and frequently thereafter), Mosser says that a "logic" is a set of rules that "range necessarily over a given domain". Outside the context of Kant's Copernican Revolution, this definition would seem to count any amount of metaphysics or science as logic. But as Mosser is concerned to explain, on Kant's view conditions necessary for experience are actively imposed by the subject. Thus to identify something as a necessary feature of experience is to suppose it to govern the operations of a thinking subject. The first chapter is dedicated to the "model of the subject" on which Mosser takes the "strategic move" known as the "Copernican Revolution" to "rest" (p. 3). This might more appropriately be called a model of cognition, as its "essence" is that human cognition requires two "heterogeneous faculties, an active faculty of understanding and a passive faculty of sensibility" (p. 24), and Mosser does not discuss the metaphysics of this agency. According to Mosser, the model is motivated by contrasting it to an "archetypal" model, on which the understanding supplies itself with the manifold of intuition, and an "ectypal" model, on which concepts are not actively contributed to experience, but are abstracted or derived from it. On Kant's alternative, the subject actively "gives order to a world it does not create", that is, to passively received material (p. 29).

Mosser claims that by showing "the active role of the subject" -- specifically the imposition of "universal and necessary conditions for [the possibility of] cognition of objects" -- to be essential to experience itself, Kant can explain "how subjective conditions of thought can have objective validity" (p. 33). In grounding an account of the "objectivating" force of subjective conditions on the dual requirements for human cognition, Mosser follows Henry Allison and Nicholas Rescher.[1] But Mosser makes the notion of an object of cognition more radically relative to the particular forms of our subjectivity. It is a commonplace of Kant scholarship that the conditions on the understanding apply more widely than those on sensibility, for things in themselves cannot be in any way represented in accordance with the forms of space and time, but can be "thought" under the conditions on the understanding, as "logically possible". This is often[2] taken to mean that the laws of (general) logic apply to things in themselves and that analytic judgments about these things can be knowledge for us. Mosser, however, maintains that the conditions imposed by the subject have no "legitimate application" outside "the domain of possible experience" (p. 29). It is not clear what he would say about Kant's use in the Antinomies of the standard of logical possibility (non-contradiction) to check the use of Reason outside this domain.[3] Mosser's main point is that the "attempt to make cognitive claims" (as opposed to the "practical employment" of Reason, which is not "cognitive") outside this domain "ends in nonsense" (p. 193). Even to say, for instance, "that things in themselves are not spatial and temporal" is just to "give the impression of making meaningful claims about objects", which is precisely the tendency Kant means to guard against (p. 203).

Mosser shows the same boldness in taking Kant at his word that we "cannot form the least conception of any other possible understanding, either such as would intuit itself, or of any that may possess an underlying mode of sensible intuition which is different in kind" from the spatiotemporal (B139).[4] The inconceivability of alternative forms supports Mosser's "deflationary" interpretation of the thing in itself as "that concept of an object according to which being an object or thing would make sense in abstraction from any idea of a (type of) subject" (quoting Arthur Melnick ((1973), 152) on p. 199, emphasis added). It allows Mosser to identify the conditions on our understanding as "rationality itself" (p. 42). And it supports his view that the relativization of logical standards to our kind of cognition is in no way an explanation of those standards. For Mosser finds in Kant a "neo-Tractarian" view of logic, on which there is no perspective "outside" logic from which its rules could be explained (p. 46).

Our inability to explain why we should be subject to just these standards seems to reflect the ineliminable role of experience in knowing that we are subject to them. Mosser does not contest Hegel's charge that the capacity for a priori knowledge, in particular, is "presupposed" by Kant as a fact.[5] Some of what Mosser says suggests that our knowledge of the rules to which we are subject should also be empirical. Mosser seems to endorse Manley Thompson's argument that to violate the law of non-contradiction is to "think nothing at all" (pp. 49-50; cf. p. 84 n. 46), so that there can be no use of understanding that does not conform to logical rules. This raises the possibility that the rules govern our sort of cognition in the way that natural laws govern the exercise of powers, so that their content is learned by observing regularities of behavior. Such an account is made natural by the analogy with grammar on which, Mosser argues, logic was understood in Kant's historical context.[6] But as Mosser makes clear, Kant is typically at pains to distinguish logic from empirical science. So although the identification of a thinker as a subject is empirical, the rules governing thought must be specified a priori. The first line of reply to Hegel is then that the conditions on this presupposed experience are known through "reflection",[7] whose "radical subjectivity" does not compromise the necessity of its findings.

For this to work, the rules must govern thought not by being impossible to violate, but by being recognized as binding.[8] This conception of the rules is natural enough given Mosser's specification of the subject to which they apply as able "to use the first-person pronoun, that is, to correctly ascribe to oneself an 'I'" and "to regard oneself as free" (pp. 77-8). However, this conception of the subject appears much richer than the two-faculty "model". Even if we can conceive no alternative to the latter, Lichtenberg-style objections to the cogito argument show it to be less clear that there can be no thought without the possibility of self-ascription by a thinker. Setting aside this issue, the capacity for reflection does not yet explain our knowledge of logical laws. For Mosser, Hegel's criticism of Kant's "reflective" method raises a "thorny" question, namely that of "metacritique", for the "choice to reflect on the possibility of thought itself": "if we have to think in accordance with rules in order to determine the rules for thought, what justifies the rules with which we attempt to make that determination?" (p. 118). Mosser takes the answer to be that "we can identify at least one specific claim that cannot possibly be rejected, in that the very thought process that would lead to such a rejection would itself have to obey, at least implicitly, the principle itself" (p. 45). Such a claim has a "peculiar modal status" alluded to in the book's title: it is "necessary for the possibility of thought, and that possibility in turn leads to the (reflective) recognition of that necessity" (p. 77).

On Mosser's interpretation, the one rule that "exemplifies" this kind of necessity is the principle of non-contradiction. The rationale for elaborating the status of this seemingly "innocuous and historically non-controversial" principle is twofold: to answer "criticisms worth considering that reject any such notion of necessity of the kind Kant requires"; and to make it plausible that "we can identify a larger set of such principles" as necessary in this sense (p. 47). Mosser suggests in passing that rationality might be subject to such further conditions as the principles of identity, excluded middle, "modus ponens, quantificational reference [and] double-negation elimination" (p. 166). But he is content to identify the conditions on rationality as those that would "have to be recognized as holding -- that is, would have to be presupposed -- for any formal presentation of a logic" (p. 87). According to Mosser, on Kant's view the completeness of any set of such rules cannot be established as fact, but pertains to them only as a "regulative ideal". So in claiming completeness for Aristotelian syllogistic, Kant did not rule out the emergence of "contemporary formal techniques in mathematical logic" (p. 90). But since these systems can express and prove mathematical principles, and derivability within logic is often taken to demarcate analytic from synthetic cognition, it is not so clear that Kant can count them as logic.

Because Mosser does not specify any rules of logic other than the principle of non-contradiction, his interpretation of the Metaphysical Deduction is open to a well-known objection. Kant takes general logic as the "leading thread" for the discovery of the categories. Jean Cavaillès argues that if this thread consists only in the requirement for thought to agree with itself, it can yield only "the emptiness of logical identity". For transcendental logic to contain (have as its "content") a multiplicity of forms, rules for thinking must be specified more concretely. But the relation to an object, which gives determinacy to the agreement required of thought, is to be supplied by transcendental logic itself. Cavaillès concludes that these rules can come only from introspection and so must lack the necessity that distinguishes logic from psychology.[9] Mosser contends that it is not clear how much depends on "whether every judgment assumes some combination of the forms Kant imports from general logic", because Kant's table of judgments is in any case "sufficiently broad in scope to capture the central aspects of the act of judgment, while not omitting anything essential", and so able "to provide an adequately rich 'clue' for the table of categories" (pp. 102-3). But I am not sure general logic is vindicated as an "adequately rich" clue, because Mosser does not explain how even a "sufficiently broad" table could be based on the principle of non-contradiction. To avoid the first horn of the dilemma, Mosser must give some assurance that general logic already has the content Kant claims for transcendental logic.

But this seems instead to be assumed. The assumption becomes explicit in Mosser's claim that general and transcendental logic do not differ "with respect to their formality" (p. 81). It is natural enough given Mosser's definition of the two logics, as necessary conditions for the possibility of thought and of experience, respectively. For the domain over which the rules of transcendental logic range is then subsumed (as a narrower range of possibility) under that of general logic. On this interpretation, a claim that seems to prefigure the entire Transcendental Deduction appears straightforward. Kant claims that whereas in general logic "the logical form of a judgment [is brought] into concepts by means of the analytical unity",[10] in transcendental logic "transcendental content" is introduced "into representations by means of the synthetic unity of the manifold of intuition in general" (A79/B105). Mosser takes this to mean simply that the understanding "takes account of" or "specifies" a domain (p. 64), the provision of which requires no further explanation. But Kant seems to regard this "introduction" as a much weightier step. He claims that transcendental logic (which he defines as "the rules of the pure thinking of an object") requires there to be "pure as well as empirical intuitions", through which objects can be "originally given a priori in ourselves" (A55-6/B79-80; cf. A76-7/B102). Given Mosser's sympathy for Kant's view that necessary conditions are imposed by the mind, it is striking that he neglects the faculty through which alone objects are given.[11]

Mosser outlines some familiar solutions to the problem of "metacritique" (justifying the rules in accordance with which we reflect), which include "specify[ing] the way 'we in fact reason in ordinary life'" and "say[ing], with Wittgenstein, that we have exhausted the idea of 'justification' and our spade is turned" (pp. 118-9). He is less concerned to distinguish Kant's position from these than to bring out its similarity to each.

Mosser claims Kant "hopes to appeal to a pre-philosophical conception of the rules of logic resonant with 'common sense'" (p. 97), an approach "best … seen in light of his reading of Rousseau" (p. 130). Kant's disparagement of "common sense" in the Prolegomena creates problems for this interpretation. Kant does say that proponents of common sense put forward the principle of non-contradiction as a proposition "for which one … need give no proof [and] need not, in general, be accountable", on pain of never reaching "an end with grounds for judgments". But his overall point is that common sense understands rules only "to the extent to which it can see [them] confirmed in experience", thus not as conditions on possible experience (4:370); he even suggests that reliance on common sense is incompatible with reflection on the powers of understanding (4:313-4). So what role can it have in the project Mosser ascribes to Kant? Mosser indicates that as the disposition to inquire into "issues of crucial importance", common sense sets "the field of philosophical inquiry" (pp. 206-7).[12] But he gives no indication that common sense has a role in selecting possible thought and experience as the domains of general and transcendental logic (respectively). Mosser's view may be that common sense proposes candidate principles, in which case it could supply the content that transcendental logic requires.[13] He suggests in an earlier chapter that "natural logic" has something like this role in the development of systematic logic. But this is not made explicit.

Throughout the book, Mosser employs Wittgenstein's metaphors to make concrete how the need to presuppose the principle of non-contradiction eliminates any "room" to justify it. The concluding chapter argues that Kant's aims, like those of Wittgenstein (both early and late), are primarily "deflationary" or "therapeutic". Mosser has strong textual evidence for the claim that the Critique's main purpose is to prevent error arising from the misuse of pure reason. But in reading the Critique as "an 'anodyne' and 'salubrious' recommendation of epistemological modesty not to venture beyond the realm of possible experience" (p. 203), he may miss a darker side. In general, Mosser identifies logic with what Kant calls a "canon" for evaluating the form of putative judgments. However, Kant claims that the function of dialectic -- exposing the errors generated by violations of these rules -- cannot be fulfilled by the canon. So logic must also have a dialectical part (A63/B88; cf. A132/B171), and (at least part of) the reason for this complication seems to be that logic (in particular syllogistic inference) is itself implicated in the tendency to error (A339/B397). According to Mosser, the critical philosophy functions "to provide scrutiny" to speculation engaged in "at the level of common sense as well as [in] attempting a more 'sophisticated' philosophical analysis", and since on his account philosophy's "critical results … cannot contradict the practices of" common sense (p. 206), the attempt at sophistication is left as the source of corrigible error. The apparent involvement of logic in this endeavor is not addressed, and no alternative account of its inevitability is offered.

In sum, proof of Mosser's central interpretative thesis (that the Critique must be read "as a book on logic") would require closer attention to Kant's text: to the Transcendental Aesthetic, which establishes the a priori intuition presupposed by Transcendental Logic; to the peculiarities of Kant's table of judgments; and to the Transcendental Dialectic.

Mosser deliberately keeps his distance from the text, on the grounds that "if we descend into the kind of analytical detail only the most committed could hope to pursue, we … risk neglecting the relevance of Kant's thought for contemporary philosophy" (x). But specifying Kant's commitments more precisely would help in at least one way to establish a place for distinctively Kantian necessity: it would differentiate them from the principles that, for Quine and Davidson, constrain which sentences a speaker can be taken to hold true. Citing Quine's declaration (in (1951)) that "No statement is immune from revision", Mosser contends that on Quine's view no statement can be accepted except "within the entire 'tribunal of experience', which would still not establish the necessity of [a] principle in a way that would satisfy Kantian requirements" (p. 49). But as early as (1935), Quine asserts that a putative affirmation-and-denial of the very same proposition must be taken to involve some other meaning for the negation sign.[14] While he would not explain the irrefragability of the principle of non-contradiction in terms of its necessity for thought itself, Quine could agree with Mosser that this principle cannot be "up for grabs" (p. 50). In Davidson's rejection of "the very notion of a conceptual scheme" and of "any talk of the a priori" (p. 154), Mosser finds more opposition to the "strict" necessity that characterizes "a priori constraints on rationality". According to Mosser, Davidson would say only that the shared assumptions that make disagreement possible are required "relative to conceptual schemes" (p. 158). But Davidson's objections target the contrast between instituted conceptual "scheme" and given experiential "content". Absent such a duality, Davidson willingly speaks of the "conceptual scheme" at "the core" of what language-users "all share", as constituted (in part) by "an underlying logical structure equivalent to the first-order predicate calculus with identity" ("Reply to Evnine", in Hahn, ed. (1999), 308-9). Mosser hints that the difference between Davidson and Kant concerns "the modal status", rather than the invariability, of this "foundation for disagreement". His discussion raises the suspicion that some Kantian apparatus is needed to underwrite Davidson's commitments,[15] but it does not provide the promised "rich confrontation" showing that Davidson needs specific insights of Kant's (p. 154) in order to, for instance, recognize some principle lying outside the common "core".[16]


Allison, Henry. Kant's Transcendental Idealism. 2nd ed. New Haven: Yale U.P., 2004.

Ameriks, Karl. "Kantian Idealism Today". History of Philosophy Quarterly 9 (1992): 329-342.

---. Interpreting Kant's Critiques. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2003.

Cavaillès, Jean. Sur la logique et la théorie de la science. Paris: Presses Universitaires de France, 1947.

Davidson, Donald. "On the Very Idea of a Conceptual Scheme". First published 1974. Reprinted in Inquiries into Truth and Interpretation (Oxford: Oxford U.P.), 1984: 183-198.

---. "A New Basis for Decision Theory". Theory and Decision 18 (1985): 87-98.

---. "A Nice Derangement of Epitaphs". First published 1986. Reprinted in The Essential Davidson (Oxford: Oxford U.P.), 2006: 251-265.

---. "The Second Person". First published 1992. Reprinted in Subjective, Intersubjective, Objective (Oxford: Oxford U.P.), 2001: 107-122.

---. "Could There Be a Science of Rationality?" International Journal of Philosophical Studies 3 (1995): 1-16.

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Kitcher, Philip. "A Priori". In The Cambridge Companion to Kant and Modern Philosophy, Paul Guyer, ed. (Cambridge: Cambridge U.P.), 2006: 28-60.

Kockelmans, Joseph, and Theodore Kisiel (eds.) Phenomenology and the Natural Sciences: Essays and Translations. Evanston: Northwestern U.P., 1970.

Kuehn, Manfred. Scottish Common Sense in Germany, 1768-1800. Kingston, Ont.: McGill-Queen's University Pr., 1987.

Posy, Carl. "The Language of Appearances and Things in Themselves". Synthese 47 (1981): 313-352.

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---. "Two Dogmas of Empiricism". Philosophical Review 60 (1951): 20-43.

---. Philosophy of Logic. 2nd ed. Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard U.P., 1986.

Rescher, Nicholas. Kant and the Reach of Reason. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2000.

Sedgwick, Sally. "Hegel on Kant's Antinomies and Distinction Between General and Transcendental Logic". Monist 74 (1991): 403-421.

Thompson, Manley. "On A Priori Truth". Journal of Philosophy 78 (1981): 458-482.

[1] Rescher makes explicit that "the relativization of the a priori facets of our knowledge to the basic resources of the human intellect is exactly what Kant's Copernican Revolution is all about" ((2000), 49). Allison defines an "epistemic condition" as "a necessary condition for the representation of objects". It is distinguished from a "psychological condition", which "governs belief or belief acquisition", by its "objectivating function". It is distinguished from an "ontological condition", which "conditions [the existence of] things quite independently of their relation to the human mind", because it "reflects the structure and operations of the human mind" ((2004), 11). In the second edition of Kant's Transcendental Idealism, Allison emphasizes that Kant's idealism not only "relativizes the concept of an object to the conditions (whatever they may be) of the representation of objects," but "depends crucially on his conception of human cognition as discursive", analysis of which serves to "specify" these conditions.

It is not clear whether the agreement between Mosser and Allison reflects influence. For Mosser's bibliography includes only the first (1983) edition of Allison's book, which, by Allison's admission, suggested that "this broad conception of an epistemic condition is … sufficient to capture what is distinctive in Kant's transcendental idealism" ((2004), 12). But as early as 1992, it was argued by Karl Ameriks that Allison's treatment "ties Kant's idealism essentially to" the duality of our cognitive faculties ((1992), reprinted in (2003), 103-4).

[2] This view is held by Allison ((2004), 17) and Rescher ((2000), 9-11), along with Carl Posy ((1981), 324) and James Van Cleve ((1999), 136).

[3] See A407/B433 and A425/B453. Mosser might argue, following Michael Wolff and (more distantly) Hegel, that the logical relationship of the Antinomies' theses and antitheses cannot be determined within general logic. See Sedgwick (1991).

[4] We can, however, "imagine" or "describe" an archetypal intellect, to contrast it with Kant's alternative model (6).

[5] Stressing that the necessity for "both a passive faculty of receiving intuitions under (within) the forms of space and time and an active faculty that judges these intuitions employing synthetic concepts a priori" cannot be "proved demonstratively", Mosser calls it a "surd fact" (27). He is quoting Nicholas Rescher (see (2000), 48), who emphasizes Kant's claim that we cannot achieve any "further explanation for … why space and time are the only forms of our possible perception" (B146). Rescher argues that for Kant "the specifically tabulated categories, the crucial forms of human understanding," are also "utterly inexplicable on rational principles (43). It should be noted, however, that alternatives to these forms are not inconceivable for Rescher in the same strong sense as for Mosser. According to Rescher, "to abrogate our particular categories of understanding is not necessarily to abrogate all categories of understanding", and the alteration involved in bringing "the prospect of different categories … into (hypothetical) play" is "not total abrogation. Something yet remains" (11).

[6] (Philip Kitcher makes this point in (2006) with respect to an analogy between grammar and a priori knowledge in general.) Indeed, where Kant employs the analogy with respect to our knowledge of logic, he likens the rules to natural laws found by observation and experiment. He first notes that everything "in nature, both in the lifeless and in the living world," such as the fall of water and movement of animals, "takes place according to rules, although we are not always acquainted with these rules": "The exercise of our powers also takes place according to certain rules that we follow, unconscious of them at first, until we gradually arrive at cognition of them through experiments and lengthy use of our powers, indeed, until we finally become so familiar with them that it costs us much effort to think them in abstracto. Thus universal grammar is the form of a language in general, for example. One [who] speaks even without being acquainted with grammar … does actually have a grammar and speaks according to rules, but ones of which he is not himself conscious. Like all our powers, the understanding in particular is bound in its actions to rules, which we can investigate." (Ak. 9:11; cf. 24:791.)

[7] "Reflection" is Kant's term for "the consciousness of the relation of given representations to our various sources of cognition". As Mosser notes, Kant identifies this as the procedure "in which we first set out to discover the subjective conditions under which we can arrive at concepts" (A260/B316).

[8] So for Mosser, we can and frequently do think contradictory thoughts, but "when made cognizant of such mistakes, we have an intellectual obligation to eliminate the inconsistency". In such a case, we "unknowingly embrace contradictory or inconsistent beliefs" (166). I take it that Mosser's dictum, "one who embraces contradictions ultimately results in thinking nothing", applies to those who knowingly embrace (162-3). Mosser's view is then the opposite of Thompson's. On the latter, a contradiction can be thought only "as such, as thought that cancels itself", for only recognition of the principle of non-contradiction prevents us from having "to think not only both p and not-p but also its negation, neither p nor not-p", and "also that neither, neither both p and not-p nor neither p nor not-p", thus to "think nothing at all" ((1981), 471n.8).

[9] Cavaillès (1947), 1-8; English translation in Kockelmans and Kisiel (1970), 357-362.

[10] Kant claims explicitly that general logic treats the bringing of "different representations … under one concept analytically" (A78/B104). And he claims to derive the table of forms of judgment in the manner in which general logic treats cognition or thought (A54-5/B78-9 and A76/B102), namely by "abstract[ing] from all content of a judgment in general, and attend[ing] only to the mere form of understanding in it" (A70/B95).

[11] Mosser explicitly sets aside the role of intuition in providing objects for concepts on the grounds that "a full account of this unification of concepts and intuitions must take into account the notoriously obscure argument of the 'Schematism'" (103). He quotes Kant's correspondence in support of his claim that only in that section is "the connection between intuitions and concepts … fully established". But since the issue here is the giving of objects in pure intuition rather than the relationship of intuitions to concepts, it is not clear why an account would have to rely on the Schematism (in addition to the Transcendental Aesthetic).

[12] Here Mosser is endorsing a claim of Manfred Kuehn's ((1987), 202).

[13] Mosser claims explicitly that Rousseau supplies the way to identify rules having the required "strong sense of universality and necessity". But the "key strategic move" in specifying "the conditions necessary for thought" does not involve common sense; it is rather "that the 'obedience to the law one prescribes to oneself is freedom'" (131). Mosser does not explain how particular rules of logic could be derived from this insight. Moreover, despite the importance of this notion of self-legislation for Kant, it is prima facie dubious that it serves this function. Mosser holds that for purposes of reflection, the subject must regard herself as free. Kant's views on freedom are difficult to interpret. But besides insisting that the basis for our cognition of our own freedom is fundamentally practical, he appears to deny that we are entitled to assert it in theoretical contexts.

[14] Pp. 96-7, as reprinted in Quine (1966). In (1986), Quine makes explicit that his response to the acceptance of a contradiction would not be to make "compensatory adjustments to block [the] indiscriminate deducibility of all sentences from an inconsistency". It is rather that "the notation ['~'] ceased to be recognizable as negation when [one who rejected the law of non-contradiction] took to regarding some conjunctions of the form 'p.~p' as true, and stopped regarding such sentences as implying all others". Thus the "deviant logician", "when he tries to deny the doctrine", "only changes the subject" (81).

[15] Mosser sees rejection of logical rules as continuous with Davidson's denial that communication requires "following shared rules and conventions" (164). He thus claims that for Davidson, all the standards by which beliefs are attributed to interpreted speakers are alike "what function as rules and conventions, or … our best epistemic practices, where success is regarded in terms of smoothness of communication" (165, citing Davidson's (1992)). Mosser contrasts this with Kant's view that "we are forced to assume that the other speaker must conform to the conditions Kant calls 'logical' if we are to have any chance of taking that speaker to be a language user" (165). The point seems to be that Kant can relate the standards to rationality and explain their normative force, while for Davidson they can have only a pragmatic basis. But this overlooks Davidson's view that in place of a shared practice, the interpreter "comes … armed with a theory that tells him (or so he believes) what an arbitrary utterance of the speaker means" ((1986), 258), and that this theory's application presupposes mastery of the "common core". Davidson is explicit that "no alternative … is available for deciding what a speaker means by" a connective "that when applied to a sentence always converts assent to dissent and vice versa" except to take it as negation. He claims that this interpretive constraint is normative in that "it imposes a small part of the interpreter's logic on the speaker" ((1985), 90-1), and more generally that the theory by which words are interpreted and attitudes ascribed is, through its assumption of "an underlying logic" (as well as constraints on the distribution of probabilities and apportionment of degrees of belief), "structured" by "standards and norms" "dictated by our concept of rationality" ((1995), 10). The difference might be that for Davidson the standards come into play only with the presence of an interlocutor, while for Kant they govern each thinker's solitary thought. But Mosser claims that Kant's a priori rules govern thought and communication (78) at once, for Kant is "committed to the idea that all thought is linguistically mediated" (60). The difference between Davidson and Mosser's Kant thus remains elusive.

[16] I am grateful to Tyler Burge and Charles Parsons for assistance in preparing this review.