Necessity Lost: Modality and Logic in Early Analytic Philosophy, Volume 1

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Sanford Shieh, Necessity Lost, Oxford University Press, 2019, 441pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199228645.

Reviewed by Bernard Linsky, University of Alberta


Sanford Shieh has made a major contribution to our understanding of the origins of analytic philosophy. This big book is densely argued, full of surprising insights about topics where he finds that common opinions are just wrong. This is the first of two projected volumes all devoted to one apparently limited question: how is it that a longstanding rejection of modal notions such as necessity and possibility was able to dominate Early Analytic Philosophy and be widely held until the 1960's? That was when a revolution was encouraged by Saul Kripke's Naming and Necessity, so that now it is common to consider questions of modal metaphysics and to see the earlier resistance to modal talk as alien and in need of explanation. Here the faulty conventional view has that this is a result of the influence of empiricism on logical positivism and its subsequent influence on analytic philosophy. For, how might we have evidence that some particular sentence is not only true, but necessarily true, when all we can observe is actual experience?

Shieh argues, however, that the origins of the rejection of modality lie in the earliest development of analytic philosophy, in views about logic in the theory of propositions of the founders Gottlob Frege, G.E. Moore and Bertrand Russell. The projected second volume will consider the next part of the story in the works of Ludwig Wittgenstein and C.I. Lewis, who led the reintroduction of modal notions into logic exclusively. For Shieh, the resistance to modal notions in analytic philosophy came from logic, not epistemology.

The first half of this volume is devoted to the anti-modal position of Frege, from Begriffsschrift in 1879, and then later, to Grundgesetze in 1893, thus surviving the split of "content" in the early work to the distinction of "sense and reference" by which the thing which is true is a thought (Gedanke). Shieh's account of Russell, by contrast, focuses primarily on his earliest views after the break from idealism started by Moore. The second half of the volume carefully analyzes Russell's most famous rejection of modal notions in logic with the material implication in Principia Mathematica. These later chapters, however, seem primarily to be a bridge to Volume II where there will be a discussion of the challenge of "strict implication" in Lewis' Survey of Symbolic Logic in 1918. Shieh's discussion of Russell in Volume I concentrates on the early views leading up to The Principles of Mathematics in 1903. He shows how the core idea about necessity survives through the several significant changes and developments in Russell's philosophy, including the adoption of symbolic logic through the theory of denoting concepts in "On Denoting" in 1905, and even into the theory of types in Principia Mathematica in 1910.

The essence of Shieh's argument is that any notion of modality would have to make a place for a truth-bearer or proposition that is true in different ways, whether as necessary or possible, as distinct from actual truth, or, by analogy, a truth that is true at some times and not others. But, Shieh shows, there is no place in either Frege or the Moore-Russell theory of truth for a truth-bearer that is true at some times and not others or relative to one possible world and not another. The body of Shieh's discussion is therefore addressed to the nature of truth for these philosophers. A thought is simply true or false, it is incomplete if it could vary from time to time. Similarly, for Russell a judgment in the Moore-Russell sense, is simply either true or false.

This view itself has a tradition in the realist reaction to Kant's philosophy, and what Kant's opponents saw as a mingling of psychological aspects of judging with the objects of judgments. Kant describes judgment in psychological terms, as the "synthesis" of "concepts" making room for the concepts to be joined together in different ways, producing problematic (merely possible), assertoric (actually true) and apodeictic (necessary) judgments. The very same conceptual constituents compose "the representations produced by judging", yet differ in the "value of the copula", and so make room for the relativizing of judgments with modalities. (p. 24)

The views about judgments that Shieh describes in Frege, Moore and Russell arise from objections to Kant and his Idealist successors in the middle of the 19th century. For example, I have haphazardly found this statement about modal judgments in Friedrich Ueberweg's 1871 System of Logic and History of Logical Doctrines. In a discussion of the truth of judgments at one time, or other "adverbial determinations", in the version of principle of contradiction by which it is impossible for something to have and not have a property at the same time:

It leaves it uncertain whether the relation of time which lies in the "at the same time" refers to the judgements themselves as acts of thought, or to their content. . . . One judgment which agrees with another in other things, but differs in determination of time, (although this difference does not enter into the verbal expression . . . ), is no longer the same judgment.

Shieh's account is full of surprising insights. One after another, he overturns our facile accounts of the origins of analytic philosophy, and finds other stories hidden in plain view in familiar texts. Each time Shieh argues with precision and care to his conclusion, with deft movement through detail, as we wait for the conclusion to come down on our head. Shieh gives his own names to doctrines and arguments, such as "the recognitional conception of judgment", but always only after they are carefully explained, and then serve later as helpful signposts to keep track of the argument. It did take over a month to read through the book, so it was not quite a "page turner", but it was compelling, even though it may take a while to digest.

Part I. Frege

Aside from a few sentences, Frege actually does not explicitly discuss modality in his works, so Shieh's argument has to be indirect. The view emerges in Frege's two different accounts of truthbearers, contents in his early Begriffsschrift from 1879 and persists through the shift to thoughts in the theory of "sense and reference" that followed after the great break in Frege's thinking around 1892. The argument proceeds by showing that contents and thoughts are simply true, and so cannot be true at a time or world, or some other manner. This is because there is no gap between the truth-bearer and what makes it true to allow such a modification. Shieh carefully shows that the view of truth, fully present in the early works, carries over to the later view. Consequently, much of Shieh's argument relies on the familiar essay "Thoughts" (1918), written late in Frege's life. That is surprising: the conventional view of that paper is that it presents a seemingly Platonistic notion of truth bearer that relates to two objects, the True and the False, as its referents. It would seem that this relation could be modified or change with time or world.

Shieh's argument against the standard view of Frege is based on Shieh's novel interpretation that he names the "recognitional view of judgment". This view of judgment is presented in contrast with that of Kant, for whom judging results from having taking a certain attitude towards the conceptual contents of the assertion, just as the speech act of assertion differs from others such as supposition. However, Shieh argues, "for Frege judging doesn't involve the logically significant production of content-representations, but it is simply acknowledging a content-representation, however produced, to be true." (p. 47) A content or thought is incomplete if it doesn't include a specification of these details, or with the specification, what seemed to be true at one time, or world, and not another, are just different contents or thoughts. Shieh clearly follows in the anti-Kantian tradition: "So we can express Frege's view here as the rejection of spatial and temporal modes of truth of thoughts: there are no truths that are everywhere or somewhere true, nor thoughts that are always or sometimes true; a thought just is true, full stop, or false, period." (p. 67) Thus Frege says clearly in The Foundations of Arithmetic, in an echo of Ueberweg, that a seemingly temporal concept like "inhabitant of Germany" does not express a concept, whereas "inhabitant of Germany at the beginning of the year 1883, Berlin time" does, and belongs to a given number for all time. Shieh finds this view, as extended to modality and logical truth throughout the various changes in Frege's views and, in particular, from the notion of contents to thoughts.

What Frege says in various writings on truth and thought consists of a number of views that seem to be puzzling at best. The connection between senses of words, grasping thoughts and understanding the meanings of sentences that many have wanted to find in Frege is not there on Shieh's interpretation. Shieh's "recognitional view", however, leads to a convincing and coherent account of the whole list of difficult or even astonishing theses that must be explained away or simply rejected. It has long been an embarrassment that Frege says truth and falsity are objects. Judgment consists in "taking the step" from a thought to one of the truth-values. Yet despite this, ascribing truth is redundant; the thought that 5 is a prime number is true says no more than 5 is a prime number. Consequently, truth is indefinable (but still an object)! Some combinations of senses which don't refer to a truth value are merely "apparent thoughts". (p. 77) But don't we know what we were trying to say?

Shieh provides a coherent and carefully supported interpretation of Frege that he summarizes as based on three "hypotheses" (p. 143):

1) The Recognitional Conception of judgment. (Judging is primarily recognizing or knowing what is the case).

2) The Supervenience Conception of truth. (Recognizing the truth of a thought supervenes on recognizing the obtaining of what that truth represents.)

3) The Judgment/Judging distinction. (Judging is a mental activity aimed at is object, truth.)

On Shieh's account, speaking of truth as an object is compatible with holding that a judgment consists in recognizing that a content or thought has a non-substantial, or "derivative property" of being true. Thus there is nothing to be known about whether a thought corresponds with the world, or anything that could be a "fundamental" property of being true. Even the "recognition" of the truth of a thought is not a matter of entertaining representations of the thought on one hand, and of the facts on the other, and becoming aware that one corresponds with the other. What then is it to recognize a truth? Suppose we think to ourselves, after observing an elementary proof, that 5 is a prime number. We have, in modern language, recognized the truth conditions for that thought. That recognition "supervenes" in Shieh's language, on recognizing the obtaining of what the truth represents.

What is recognized as being the case in making a judgment is what the thought judged represents as being the case. That is to say, what is recognized is the obtaining of what that thought represents as being the case. But if what is represented obtains, then the representation is true. (p. 104)

This "Recognitional Conception" implies that judgment is factive because recognizing is factive. To make the judgment that p is to recognize that p is the case. But surely, one might think, we can make false judgments? No, says Shieh. One must distinguish the activity of judging (urteilen), which is not factive, and judgments, which are factive and, indeed, the constitutive goal of judging. (p. 124). These apparent thoughts, as we have when we think using non-referring names, do not express thoughts, and they do not determine a truth value. (p. 136) Shieh does not go on to say much about his view of judging. It is clear that thinking about Michael Dummett's anti-realism is somewhere behind this striking new interpretation of Frege. While Shieh does not set out an overarching survey of how his view of Frege stands in relation to the literature of the past forty years, he does set out his novel ideas carefully and supports specific points by a careful assessment of conflicting opinions.

All of these proposals for interpreting various issues in the interpretation of Frege come together when Shieh returns to his goal of explaining the rejection of modality in Early Analytic Philosophy. He calls this the "basic argument for truth relativism":

compositions of senses that don't determine truth values on account of containing components that don't determine references are apparent thoughts . . . We can judge these defective thoughts but there are no judgments of them. But if a purported thought is true or false only relative to a time, place, or possible world, then by itself it fails to determine a truth-value. It follows that it is a defective apparent thought. (p. 136)

Part II. Russell and Moore

Shieh explains Russell's rejection of modality as originating in his rejection of the correspondence theory of truth and of even a distinction of truth bearers from truth-makers that could make room for something true or false at a time or a world but not simply true. These ideas come from Moore's account of judgment, which Russell adopted wholeheartedly in his early writings. Moore's views on propositions and truth arises out of the rejection of F.H. Bradley's idealism. This was one of the first steps in the break with Idealism that is the origin of the British school of analytic philosophy. On this early "Moore-Russell" view, judgments assert the truth of complexes of concepts, some of which are true and some false. Concepts are related to each other in judgments, which each have the primitive properties of truth or falsehood. Like Frege, Moore does not take propositions to be mind-independent representations of the world. Rather, they are composed of concepts that are thus part of the world themselves. Propositions are not representations of the world, nor are they the products of an activity of the mind by combining mental states.

Against Bradley [Moore and Russell] deny that judging involves predicating a concept of reality, and hold instead that to judge is simply to affirm a single complex object, which is, in itself absolutely true or absolutely false. (p. 304)

By the time of Russell's Lectures on Philosophy of Logical Atomism in 1918-19, it is clear that Russell had a notion of "truth-making" and so, presumably a notion of proposition that might be made true in a relative matter. Yet at this very time, Russell had abandoned propositions in favor of his "multiple relation theory of judgement". Shieh aims to resolve these problems in Volume II where his focus will be on Wittgenstein's "picture theory" of truth. In this volume, however, Shieh concentrates on the earlier "Moore-Russell" theory of propositions.

Some of the most ingenious and novel revisions of standard wisdom in Shieh's book come in discussions that are almost asides in the course of the argument against the relativity of truth in Frege and Russell. As one example, in the course of explaining the origins of the Moore-Russell realism, and prominently within that, Shieh gives an account of Russell's dispute with Bradley over "external relations". It might seem that the origin of Russell's opposition to modality came from his maintenance of external relations in opposition to Bradley. Bradley asks what could unify an instance of an external relation, say aRb. There must be some relation between a and R, between R and b, and a further relation to those relations, thus starting "Bradley's regress". An attempt to assert that the difference between internal and external relations is grounded in the "nature" of the related objects a and b, might seem to invoke some distinction between necessary properties of an object (which determine its nature) and those that are not. However, on Shieh's illuminating account, it is rather that Bradley's demand for an "explanation" or "ground" is a request for an explanation of particular instances of relations. Why a is related by R to b, when it might not have been, and so is only contingently true? What looks like Russell's insistence that we have here a brute fact is simply an assertion that one cannot say more of a logical nature about why aRb if it is simply true that aRb.

Yet another bit of conventional wisdom that Shieh rejects is the view that Russell's views on modality in logic come from his adoption of the "material conditional" p implies q, symbolized as "p Éq", true just in case p is false or q is true. Russell does embrace the counterintuitive "paradoxes of material implication" that astonished Lewis. Yet Russell, we learn, had reason to adopt the material conditional as fundamental to the very nature of logic. Shieh argues that there is a deeper argument behind Quine's charge that Russell's confusion of material implication with logical implication is a confusion of use and mention. The deeper basis of Quine's objection is the claim that Russell does not distinguish two sorts of implication, in particular a logical implication or logical consequence, and the material conditional. For Russell, the notion of implication is fundamental to logic, and, as an indefinable is not a candidate for a semantic or meta-linguistic account. But, Shieh argues, Russell does have two sorts of implication. There is material implication p Éq, but also formal implication, expressed in Principles as p Éx q, or, as the universal quantification of an implication, as in ("x) (Fx É Gx). Russell's prior rejection of modality makes him unable to say this is a necessary connection between p and q, but instead it is simply a generalization about particular cases of implication. The meaning of these basic, indefinable, notions of logic is rather to be discovered by examining their role in logical inference. It is not possible to go further to give an "analysis" of logical consequence in terms of what makes it impossible for an antecedent to be true and the conclusion false. (pp. 352-365). This view of the conditional as basic even survives the move to Principia Mathematica, where the conditional "if p then q" is defined as equivalent to "not p or q". It's been suggested by others such as James Levine and Michael Beaney that the conception of "analysis" underwent a shift from the original "Moorean" conception to a more pragmatically justified choice made for theoretical purposes. Shieh provides an example to support this view of Russell.

Shieh proposes a second volume in which he will discuss the views of modality of Lewis and Ludwig Wittgenstein. In an early section "Looking Ahead", Shieh tells us some of what is coming. Lewis' adoption of necessity is not based directly on rejection of material implication. Rather, the objection is to Russell's account of logic as a priori. Wittgenstein, with his fully developed account of propositions and truth makers, might be able to make truth relative to a time or world. Rather, Shieh says, Wittgenstein's view of logical truth must take them as necessarily true. So, as with Frege, Moore, and Russell, the notion of necessity is tied to logical truth, and not to the sort of modal metaphysics that was still rejected by analytic philosophy for so long. I'm keenly awaiting the appearance of Volume II of Shieh's monumental work. In the meantime, there is much to digest in the many riches in Volume I.