Negative Certainties

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Jean-Luc Marion, Negative Certainties, Stephen E. Lewis (tr.), University of Chicago Press, 2015, 278pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780226505619.

Reviewed by Kevin Hart, The University of Virginia


For over twenty years Jean-Luc Marion has been exploring a new field of phenomenology that centers on what he calls the "saturated phenomenon." The work commenced with Réduction et donation (1989; Eng. 1998) and its closure is announced in Certitudes négatives (2010; Eng. 2015). Yet there will be more to read about it with the publication of Marion's 2014 Gifford Lectures, coming out in English translation as Givenness and Revelation (2016) -- the French will appear later and will be an expansion of the English -- and in a forthcoming volume of responses to critics of the theory of saturated phenomena, Reprise du donné. The theory has been extended in various directions, most notably in Le phénomène érotique (2003; Eng. 2007) and Au lieu de soi (2008; Eng. 2012). The central study in this venture, Étant donné (1st ed., 1997, 2nd ed. corrected, 1998; Eng. 2002), is already recognized as one of the major works of French phenomenology, while a slightly later inquiry, De surcroît (2001; Eng. 2002), elaborates the sorts of saturation in more concrete fashion than was possible in the earlier more theoretical book.

Marion began his scholarly career as an historian of philosophy and became a creative philosopher only with his account of saturated phenomena. Before then, his originality was most readily discernable in his forays into theology, such as Dieu sans l'être (1st ed., 1982; Eng. 1991). His appearance as an authentic philosopher is marked by an unusual shift. He begins as a critical follower of Heidegger yet eventually also starts to swim in a strong current of Husserl's thought. Now "Husserl" means various things to different people. One usually is attracted to one or another version of him: the author of the Logische Untersuchungen (1900-01), the Ideen (1913-), the Cartesianische Meditationen (written in 1931), the Krisis (written in 1936), or the explorer of ante-predicative life in Formale und transzendentale Logik (1929) and Erfahrung und Urteil (1948); and of course any Husserlians of strict observance will also devote themselves to the Nachlass. Marion is unusual in that he gravitated to Husserl's early lectures, given in 1905, after the breakthrough of the Logische Untersuchungen, and published separately as Die Idee der Phänomenologie. There Marion found a radical vision of phenomenology that was later muted by Husserl; it is a philosophy of "absolute self-givenness" that turns on being able to locate "the absolute clarity of the given."[1]

Early phenomenology starts as a criticism of epistemology, as practiced in Husserl's day; it is directed against psychologism, and also against empiricism with its view that ideas and perceptions are mere representations. It seeks to secure firm knowledge by way of leading any transcendent thing to the immanence of consciousness cleansed of psychological or empirical adhesions. This process of leading back is what Husserl calls "reduction," and its theory was to concern him (and distract him) for decades. Suffice it to say that reduction does not lead one to a separate internal state, as Eugen Fink urges us to believe, but only to givenness [Gegebenheit], and that to a greater or lesser degree.[2] Did Husserl's reduction truly lead to givenness, however? Heidegger doubted it, thinking that Husserl remained trammeled in a theoretical distinction between subject and object, and maintained that the genuine reduction was from beings to being; and, in his turn, Marion has argued that a "third reduction" is needed, one that slips past Husserl's metaphysics of the subject and even Heidegger's meditations on Sein and reaches givenness itself.[3]

There is much to say about the narrative that Marion tells us about the history of phenomenology, and in particular attention will need to be given to what he sees in Husserl and what he have tended to overlook or diminish in order to develop his theory. For example, Husserl's genetic phenomenology, important for Derrida, seems to be of less significance for Marion. The claim on which Marion fastens, though, is widely shared among readers of Husserl, namely that he sought to correlate one's intentional rapport with something with one's intuition of it, and that although he prized donating intuition as the "principle of all principles" he nonetheless insisted on the intentional horizon as conditioning manifestation.[4] Marion's insight is that there is a range of phenomena that exceed any intentional horizon (whether perceptual, anticipatory, re-collective, imaginative, and so on), and, with a backwards look at Kant's table of categories, he offers a typology of this excess by way of the event (saturation of quantity), the idol (saturation of quality), the flesh (saturation of relation), and the icon (saturation of modality).[5] So we find four types of paradoxical phenomena, with divine revelation involving all four, and many intriguing analyses of being overwhelmed or frustrated by encountering paradoxical phenomena in what he calls "counter-experience."[6]

Even though Marion passes in some respects from Heidegger to Husserl he nonetheless retains Heidegger's view that Husserl could not escape the metaphysics of the subject. Husserl's position is perhaps more complex than Marion admits; the issue is less to do with a metaphysical division between subject and object than with an epistemological insistence that each intentional experience is either an objectifying act or relies on one. At any rate, phenomenality, how things appear, belongs by right to the phenomenon, Marion thinks. It is not shared, as Husserl thought, between phenomenon and transcendental consciousness. What appears is for a consciousness, although consciousness does not really contain it. At heart, for Marion the issue in play is not the priority of intuition over intentionality but the nature and scope of phenomenality.[7] The phenomenality of something, he maintains, is not what shows itself, if indeed something does, but rather the extent of its givenness. Two things should be noted here. First, for Marion, anything has the right to appear in its own way, irrespective of whether or not it is held to exist: the kingdom of phenomenality is increased not just by the addition of some previously unnoticed extraordinary phenomena but by recognizing that all manner of phenomena, many of them quite banal, are saturated. Second, saturated phenomena are received, not constituted; the "subject" is replaced by l'adonné, the one born to the gift. The contention is about constitution, not the nature of the cogito: a point that is easily missed. For Husserl conceives the cogito as a flux without beginning or end, more like l'adonné in some respects that some of Marion's admirers would like to think. Not that Marion rejects constitution as such. We constitute only weak and common-law phenomena: for example, simple arithmetical entities for the former, and physical objects in a high school laboratory for the latter. Exactly how we switch from constituting to receiving is, to my mind, not yet made clear.

The correlation between intentionality and intuition that I mentioned a moment ago is much brooded on by Husserl. He seeks to discover the alignment between the specific intentional stream in play and how something gives itself or, in the language of Ideen I, between noesis and noema; and for that to happen one must pass from the "natural attitude" of naïve realism to the "phenomenological attitude" of transcendental idealism (in Husserl's rather than Kant's sense of the expression). Correlation is supposed to yield certainty, people say (with good reason) after reading Husserl. But one must read quite a lot of Husserl before being sure what he finally means. As he says in a note dating from 1922 or 1923, the certainty that one seeks in the ego occurs only in the possibility of repeating a fulfilled intuition.[8] Certainty is to be attained in specific acts of noetic-noematic correlation, which of course occur only after reduction, but which offer no more than momentary certainty.

Knowledge is of course linked to certainty, yet for Marion this is a starting point rather than a conclusion. On his understanding, we traditionally gain knowledge "by reducing the thing in itself [la chose en soi] to an object" (2). The Kantian phrasing is to be regretted since he is speaking simply of a thing as such. In any case, this is a position Marion usually takes to be endorsed by Husserl but who is not mentioned explicitly here. (The important point is, as I have indicated, that Husserl insists on the primacy of objectifying acts.) Yet there are phenomena, Marion argues, that resist the conditions of objectification, and these saturated phenomena can be discerned in counter-experience. So one can speak of "knowledge without an object" (2-3). Further, one can claim "knowledge without certainty" (3), for science repeatedly supplies us with all sorts of knowledge while reserving the right to revise its claims, sometimes very significantly. What I was told in science classes with grave certainty about the universe when I was a boy has been revised countless times since then, and perhaps before I am much older the knowledge of dark matter and dark energy that I possess now will be modified or replaced. After having unsettled us a little, Marion proceeds to his central claim, which rests on the authority of Descartes. In the Regulæ, which Marion has edited, we are told that there are things one wants to know but which exceed the capacity of the human mind; but, by itself, that realization does not render us ignorant. On the contrary, it is "knowledge in no less degree than the knowledge of anything else."[9] So we have "negative certainty" that either the thing we wish to know about or our human condition "renders the experience impossible and the answer unknowable" (5).

Marion's merit is not merely to have returned to Descartes and applied his insight to our experience of the natural sciences but to have enlarged phenomenality from its initial delineation by Husserl. The first increase occurs in recognizing that many phenomena appearing as objects are in fact being constrained to do so by an intentional horizon, and that when we see them exceed that horizon they can be grasped as "giving themselves in themselves" (202). This is a nascent hermeneutics, for any act of self-giving presumes a time and a place (and here Marion appeals to Dasein rather than to the Husserlian "subject"). The second widening of the field takes place in the recognition that with such self-giving phenomena intuition exceeds concept. And the third extension is precisely that of "negative certainties" (205): the vast field of knowledge of what we cannot know is brought to the very horizon of appearing, albeit in negative. Doubtless this last broadening of the field is why Marion, with the publication of Negative Certainties, takes his exploration of saturated phenomena to have concluded. Phenomenality has been stretched as far as it will go.

So readers who pick up the French original, and think that perhaps Marion is addressing John Henry Newman will be very disappointed. Newman distinguishes "certitude" from "certainty," maintaining that the former is a state of mind in which one is convinced of the truth of a state of affairs, while the latter, in its various degrees, turns on the evidence that supports a proposition.[10] One might entertain many positions that are not quite certain yet nonetheless enjoy certitude. However, the French certitude is best translated, and inevitably so in the context of Marion's thought, as "certainty." Other readers who might think that Marion might be continuing a strain of thought on non-knowing [non-savoir] that begins with Bataille and Blanchot will also be disappointed. There is no interest in a quasi-mystical "denuding of the soul," as one finds in Meister Eckhart, and no "learned ignorance," as one discovers in Nicholas of Cusa.[11] His concerns, rather, are with the human being as strictly unable to be defined, with God as impossible, with the event as unforeseeable, and with problems to do with the gift, principally sacrifice and forgiveness. Readers of Marion will be familiar to some extent with his account of the event, although they will find new things to ponder in his attempt to think of the gift as grounded in givenness. The philosophical and theological dimensions of this last bold thought are yet to be properly understood and evaluated, and it may be some time before conversation about them has reached a satisfying conclusion. It will involve reflection on modern European philosophy -- from Descartes and Kant to Heidegger and Derrida -- on the one hand, and systematic discussion of Grace, beginning with reference to de Lubac and Rahner, on the other. I will attend here to what is most likely to be new in Negative Certainties, even to readers of Marion: his philosophical anthropology and his conception of God as "impossible," which augments his discussion of the deity in Dieu sans l'être and brings it into conversation with Derrida's final work.

"Know thyself!" [γνῶθι σεαυτόν]: the Delphic words speak with authority, coming from the very dawn of western philosophy, even though we have no idea to whom they should be ascribed. Exactly what is intended by those two Greek words is far from clear, however. Are we enjoined not to listen to the crowd but to form our own views, or to be aware of what we can actually do and not to trespass past the limits assigned to us as mortals? These interpretations remain within the orbit of Greek thought. Augustine experiences something new in sensing himself to be under the divine gaze: in cuius oculis mihi quaestio factus sum.[12] He is divided internally between the man who loves beauty and the Christian who loves God, and so he does not have the self-knowledge that he desires. Some streams of modernity continue the thought of the Greeks (Montaigne's, for one), while others remain more Augustinian (Pascal's, for example). Even so, philosophers, especially phenomenologists, have been able to hear the two words differently. As Marion observes, with Kant as support, the philosopher is the one "who preeminently knows that she will never know herself in the manner in which she knows every other thing" (10). (The choice of the feminine gender is the translator's act of piety. Marion writes, "sait qu'il ne se connaîtra jamais lui-même à la mannière dont il connaît toute autre chose" (24).) A paradox is implicit in the modern understanding of the aphorism: as soon as I know myself, I do not know myself. I would know myself merely as a thing, not as a knower.

It is the appearing of this paradox that interests Marion, and he refuses any thought of it as an impasse such as one finds with Foucault for whom "man," regarded as a recent invention, "may very well inevitably have to disappear, like a fragile sand castle that the rising tide obliterates" (19).[13] Marion remains in the wake of Augustine and Pascal, especially the latter whom he cites: "Learn that man infinitely transcends man, hear from your master: your true condition, which is unknown to you" (20; Pensées § 131). In the busy traffic of modern thought, the idea can be found in unlikely places, such as in Nietzsche's theory of the Übermensch and, one might add, Rahner's theological anthropology. Despite the apparently benign humanist interest in separating man from other animals by way of a definition, any attempt to fix, and so limit, the meaning of oneself as a human by way of a concept ends up degrading the one defined. I can share the other person's humanity, Marion tells us, only if we also share "the same indefinition [indéfinition]" (37), only if we mutually resist becoming an object under the other's gaze. So degradation comes by way of objectification (27), and once again we are back with Marion's tussle with Husserl and a tradition that ripens in him. Levinas appears only in passing in Negative Certainties, but doubtless in reading Marion's pages we can feel his friend's final distaste for the Husserl who appears in his Théorie de l'intuition (1963): a philosopher who, despite his desire to speak concretely about phenomena, ends up giving intuition "an intellectualist character."[14]

Yet this criticism of Husserl, made directly by Levinas and indirectly by Marion, is perhaps formulated too quickly, since for him the "theoretical attitude," important as it is in the development of science, and to the recognition of human responsibility, is also often a stage in the shift from the "natural attitude" to what it occludes: the "personalistic attitude" and the "phenomenological attitude."[15] For Husserl, another person is never merely an intentional object for me, for he or she transcends me and does so more starkly than any object can. (It is the closest that he comes to forging an argument for the existence of the external world.) One facet of my experience of another person is brushing against a limit of my transcendental ego's ability to master the world about me, to fix it simply by way of concepts.[16] If I look to another person, Husserl suggests in the Nachlass, I can see that "human being" cannot be regarded as an object to be neatly comprehended by a concept. Interestingly, neither Husserl nor Marion says anything about non-human animals. One might say that the non-human animal gives us an even surer sense of another ego's transcendence, for we can tell far less about what a cat or a dog is thinking or feeling than we can about another human being. Would it follow that to define a non-human animal would degrade it? That is not Husserl's question, but it might well be put to Marion who wishes to establish that I appear to myself as a saturated phenomenon. It is difficult to say how a cat or a dog appears to itself. But do we have any reason to think that Rover or Felix figures himself merely as an object?

"What is proper to God?," is a classical question in theology as it is in the philosophy of religion. We usually answer, in a metaphysical key, by listing the divine attributes, and distinguishing the negative from the positive, and the communicable from the incommunicable. It is only to be expected that a phenomenologist such as Marion will take a different tack. For him, it is the impossible that is proper to the deity. Indeed, this is so for three reasons. We cannot intuit God, neither by the senses nor by the "spiritual senses"; we cannot form a concept of God, since he is absolutely singular; and we cannot experience him as a phenomenon. The last claim is bound to excite the most controversy, for it will be said that the Bible supplies all sorts of examples of God appearing to people, either visually or by way of audition (Gen. 17: 1, Gen. 18: 1, Ex. 6: 2-3, and so on). We also read in Scripture that God cannot be seen (Ex. 33: 20); and so one might conclude that God appears in theophanies without being seen. Heidegger was not the only person to ponder a "phenomenology of the inapparent."[17] Nor is Judeo-Christianity the sole religious constellation to entertain the idea. We need only recall Odyssey 22: 235. Yet the Judeo-Christian God is incomprehensible, Marion reminds us (presumably with Chrysostom's homilies in mind); and, given this, he observes that we cannot experience God but that he can appear in counter-experience. That is, we experience a phenomenon that resists the conditions of objectification. Perhaps 1 Kings 19: 11-13 is perhaps the best example the Bible has to offer, but even here one can think of the thin voice of silence as a phenomenon.

The question of God is irreducible, Marion maintains; it is always intelligible as a question, and it will always impose itself on us in one way or another, even though it is impossible to answer. It differs from other unanswerable questions in large part because it can always be posed anew, in fresh terms, and so escape censure. "The question of God survives the impossibility of God," Marion assures us (59). Consistent with this claim is the position that God himself is irreducible: he cannot be led back to a purified consciousness or, in Marion's schema, be received by l'adonné.[18] Husserl would have agreed, although he allowed the possibility that God is always already in consciousness; in that respect he was closer to Descartes than Marion is.[19] Yet must we think of reduction as always passing from the outside to the inside, bringing "real being" home to "absolute being"?[20] Is it not possible, at least within Christianity, to see it as a passage from "world" to "Kingdom" that is performed precisely by the preaching of Jesus?[21] A phenomenological understanding of the New Testament reveals that it is not God who is to be reduced but rather human beings who are to be led back by μετάνοια to a new relationship with the Father made possible in and through Jesus. Jesus does not ask us to find God in intuition, and he is not in the business of making concepts. Yet like the patriarchs and prophets before him, he proposes a metaphor for God, Father. And he nowhere suggests that this Father will be experienced as an object. The faith that we are asked to cultivate does not bring God into the presence of consciousness but rather allows us to hope that we are present to God.

Marion is the pre-eminent living representative of the "theological turn" in phenomenology. Along with Jean-Yves Lacoste, he has done more to introduce the question of God into phenomenology considered as a philosophical school than anyone else; and Negative Certainties shows him continuing to do that, not only by way of reflection on God as impossible but also, and more concretely, in his accounts of forgiveness and sacrifice (chapter 4). The level of philosophical invention and comprehension of detail is extremely impressive, and one finally puts down the book with a sense of a thinker who has become a complete master of his own thought within the limits it has been allowed to run. That is quite a way: in addition to extending phenomenology sensu stricto, there have been contributions to the visual arts, to our understanding of love, how we can best figure Descartes's immense contribution to modern thought, and of course religion. In terms of religion, the limits are those of Judeo-Christianity.

Yet one might pause and wonder if there is another path that could be taken, one that recognizes the phenomenological structures of Christianity itself and does not seek to place the religion under the lens of phenomenological analysis, even one that remains aloof from "method" and instead proposes a "counter-method."[22] Christian phenomenology would not begin with intentionality and intuition, but would attend to that latecomer in phenomenology, reduction, though only in the figure of a reduction from "world" to "Kingdom." To take that path would be to find that God invisibly discloses himself in the very life of the Kingdom and in the very life of Jesus. Put differently, the phenomenality of God is divided between Jesus and the Kingdom. Yet it would also involve taking a decisive step, crossing the wavy line that separates Philosophy from Theology, though without forgetting the phenomenology one has learned from Husserl, Heidegger, Merleau-Ponty, Levinas, and, indeed, Marion.

[1] Edmund Husserl, The Idea of Phenomenology, trans. William P. Alston and George Nakhnikian, intro. George Nakhikian (Martinus Nijhoff, 1973), 6, 7.

[2] See Eugen Fink, Sixth Cartesian Meditation, trans. and intro. Ronald Bruzina (Indiana University Press, 1995), esp. § 5 and p. 120.

[3] See Martin Heidegger, The Basic Problems of Phenomenology, trans., intro. and lexicon by Albert Hofstadter, rev. ed. (Indiana University Press, 1988), 21, and Marion, Reduction and Givenness, trans. Thomas A. Carlson (Northwestern University Press, 1998), 204-5.

[4] See Husserl, Ideas Pertaining to a Pure Phenomenology and to a Phenomenological Philosophy, I, trans. Fred Kersten (Kluwer Academic Publishers, 1983), § 24.

[5] See Marion, Being Given, trans. Jeffrey L. Kosky (Stanford University Press, 2002), § 23.

[6] For "counter-experience," see Marion, Being Given, § 22.

[7] See Husserl, "The Amsterdam Lectures," Psychological and Transcendental Phenomenology and the Confrontation with Heidegger (1927-1931), trans. and ed., Thomas Sheehan and Richard E. Palmer (Kluwer Academic Publishers, 1997), 218.

[8] See Husserl, Analyses Concerning Passive and Active Synthesis, trans. Anthony J. Steinbock (Kluwer Academic Publishers, 2001), 457.

[9] René Descartes, "Rules for the Direction of the Mind," The Philosophical Works, 2 vols., trans. Elizabeth S. Haldane and G. R. T. Ross (Cambridge University Press, 1972), I, 28.

[10] See J. H. Newman, An Essay in Aid of a Grammar of Assent (Longmans, Green and Co., 1901), 344.

[11] See, for example, Maurice Blanchot, A World in Ruins, trans. Michael Holland (Fordham University Press, 2016), 18.

[12] Augustine, Confessions, X. 33. 50.

[13] Marion alludes to Foucault's well-known apocalyptic flourish at the very end of The Order of Thing, no trans. (Vintage Books, 1994), 387.

[14] Emmanuel Levinas, The Theory of Intuition in Husserl's Phenomenology, trans. André Orianne (Northwestern University Press, 1973), 157. Levinas of course admits that his reading of Husserl is restricted to the published work available at that time.

[15] See Husserl, Ideas Pertaining to a Pure Phenomenology and to a Phenomenological Philosophy, II, trans. Richard Rojcewicz and André Schuwer (Kluwer Academic Publishers, 1989), § 49.

[16] Husserl approaches the point in Cartesian Meditations, trans. Dorion Cairns (Martinus Nijhoff, 1977), § 50, but see especially, Zur Phänomenologie der Intersubjektivität. Texte aus dem Nachlass. Dritter Teil: 1929-1935, ed. Iso Kern (Martinus Nijhoff, 1973), 631, and Erste Philosophie (1923/24) Zweiter Teil, ed. Rudolf Boehm (Martinus Nijhoff, 1966), 495.

[17] See Martin Heidegger, Four Seminars, trans. Andrew Mitchell and François Raffoul (Indiana University Press, 2003), 80.

[18] On this issue, see Marion, Figures de phénoménologie (Vrin, 2012), 188.

[19] See Husserl, Ideas I, 116-17.

[20] See Husserl, Ideas I, 110.

[21] See my Kingdoms of God (Indiana University Press, 2015), esp. chapters 6 and 7.

[22] See Marion, Being Given, § 1.