Neo-Aristotelian Perspectives on Contemporary Science

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William M.R. Simpson, Robert C. Koons and Nicholas J. Teh (eds.), Neo-Aristotelian Perspectives on Contemporary Science, Routledge, 2018, 337 pp., $140.00, ISBN 9780415792561.

Reviewed by Steven French, University of Leeds


Neo-Aristotelian' approaches to the metaphysics of science have enjoyed a significant resurgence in recent years. What counts as such, however, may not always be clear. Here the editors helpfully list some relevant 'criteria of demarcation', which I'll give in reverse order (pp. 1-2): first the rejection of Platonism, in the sense of non-immanent entities such as universals or mathematical objects; second, a sparse theory of real essences or natural kinds; third, a pluralist account that includes both simple and composite entities; and fourth, a structured view that designates some of these entities as fundamental and the rest as derivative. Now I'll pause there because I suspect many readers will be nodding their heads and muttering 'Sounds fine to me so far . . . ". But then comes the kicker: a commitment to a metaphysics of potentiality, typically manifested in the form of a causal powers ontology. This is where many of us balk, not least because of naturalistic concerns over whether such a metaphysics can find a place in the context of modern physics.

Throughout this volume, however, however, it is the related notion of 'hylomorphism' that is the real focus of attention. Classically, this was understood as the doctrine that substances should be conceived of as formed matter, but it is how this notion of 'form' is understood in the modern context that provides the central issue of interest here, not least because its explication reveals useful connections and comparisons with alternative accounts involving mechanisms, processes and structures.

So, in 'Hylomorphism and the New Mechanist Philosophy of Biology, Neuroscience and Psychology', Daniel De Haan offers a helpful 'compare and contrast' exercise, in which he argues that the 'New Mechanist Philosophy' (NMP) of Carl Craver et al. is committed to 'a touchstone of hylomorphism' (p. 193), namely 'structure realism' (not to be confused with structural realism, as we'll see). Of course, there are differences: advocates of NMP eschew downward causation, for example, arguing instead that inter-level relations should be taken to be constitutive. Nevertheless, De Haan maintains that the contrast is less substantive than might be thought and, more generally, urges a more productive conversation between Neo-Aristotelians and New Mechanists. Such a call is to be welcomed, not least for offering the hope of rendering certain of the claims held by the former more palatable for naturalistically inclined metaphysicians of science.

Having said that, it is not at all clear how enthusiastically neo-Aristotelians themselves will respond. De Haan heavily cites William Jaworski, who characterises 'structure realism' in terms of taking 'empirical appeals to structure at face value' and regards structure itself as 'a basic ontological and explanatory principle' (p. 297). However, in his own contribution, 'Psychology Without a Mental-Psychology Dichotomy', Jaworski insists that what the neo-Aristotelian means here is entirely different from what the structural realist has in mind (p. 264). Yet despite his somewhat grisly illustration involving the squashing of a body in a bag, the distinction remains unclear. Apparently, the neo-Aristotelian conception incorporates a dynamic aspect but of course the structural realist is more than happy to acknowledge that! More significantly, Jaworski argues that if we view psychology and neuroscience from such a structuralist perspective, the mental-physical dichotomy evaporates and all its attendant problems can hence be set to one side (p. 282).

Adding a dynamic aspect to structure brings the hylomorphic stance close to that of process philosophy, which has recently been deployed within the philosophy of biology by John Dupré and his team. However, this approach is rejected by David Oderberg, in 'The Great Unifier: Form and the Unity of the Organism', in favour of the idea that what marks out an organism is that it has 'a substantial form simpliciter' (p. 218), whereas the kinds of examples that Dupré and Co. like to highlight (such as multi-species collectives, like lichens), have such forms only 'secundum quid', or in a manner of speaking. Thus, organisms are said to possess substantial forms, collectives to contain them and organs to 'abtain' them. With the introduction of such terminology and the insistence that 'substantial form is a metaphysical posit, not an empirical hypothesis' (p. 229), those not yet signed up to the neo-Aristotelian project might well feel that it is beginning to sail a little too far from the shores of naturalism.

And that feeling grows all the stronger as one proceeds through the other contributions. In 'Structural Powers and the Homeodynamic Unity of Organisms', Christopher Austin and Anna Marmodoro, for example, offer their own account of the unity of organisms by again appealing to a structural feature, but now informing a new type of power, whose manifestation consists in a 'kind of self-directed activity' (p. 171). However, although 'encoded' within the organisms themselves, such powers are not reducible to any physical element, nor are they to be equated with the functional coordination of such elements (p. 173). The as yet uncommitted reader is then left grasping at metaphors -- this power is like 'symphonic software' that is characterised by 'conductorial activity' (ibid.) -- which slip like so much water between the fingers. Austin's solo effort, 'A Biologically Informed Hylomorphism', goes some way towards solidifying things via an appeal to the topology of a kind of state-space in which the system can be said to 'flow' towards certain states. Insofar as this state-space represents 'the possible' outstripping 'the actual' (p. 199), the dynamic structure that gives shape and texture to the holistic form underpinning the hylomorphism is inherently modal and here perhaps we start to move beyond simple invocations of 'potentiality'.

The above essays all appear in the second half of the book, which is concerned with 'The Philosophy of the Life Sciences' and where the notion of 'form' gets some intuitive grip. The first half is, of course, devoted to 'The Philosophy of Physics' and there the grip is looser. Thus, Edward Feser argues, in his 'Actuality, Potentiality and Relativity's Block Universe', that we 'have good apriori reason to believe that the appearance of a timeless and changeless world presented by relativity is merely an appearance, an artefact of the method by which physics studies physical reality rather than a discovery about the nature of physical reality itself.' (36). Insofar as this method involves mathematization, it cannot cover the whole of physical reality, he claims, and so room is left for the insertion of a hylomorphic metaphysics capable of accounting for change and temporal passage. Once again structure makes an appearance, as Feser declares his allegiance to 'epistemic' structural realism, with the true nature of things remaining hidden behind what we can know. Leaving aside the worry that allowing room for these metaphysical speculations is indicative of just what's wrong with this version of structuralism (and Feser's rejection of the ontic version -- which he takes, rightly, to be a potential obstacle - can be contested, in the light of more recent developments), an obvious question can be asked -- why this kind of metaphysics and not some other? Or why any such extra metaphysics at all in this particular case, given that various accounts of how the impression of temporal passage can be reconciled with relativity theory are currently 'on the table'?

Similarly, in his deployment of 'substantial form' in the service of 'The Many Worlds Interpretation of QM', Robert Koons focuses on the age-old problem of recovering the 'manifest' image of the approximately classical world from the 'scientific' image of the quantum wave function (p. 70). Today's Everettian does this by reducing all features and entities of the former to functional roles realized by the latter. Identifying these roles with the results of Ramseyfication, cast here in model-theoretic form, Koons then mounts a Putnam-style permutation argument to yield a kind of radical referential indeterminacy covering not only the assignment of quantum probabilities to particular branches but also the very theories we might entertain about the emergent world of macroscopic objects in general. What is required, he insists, is some kind of top-down constraint, and after surveying various possibilities he opts for the real essences of 'emergent' macroscopic entities, situated in the hierarchy as co-fundamental with the quantum-mechanical facts. As a result, we get a 'hylomorphic interpretation of Everettian quantum mechanics' (p. 95) according to which only one branch in the multiplicity is ever selected by virtue of the presence of a substantial form that is responsible for the composition of such entities, with all other branches containing 'compositional zombies' (p. 97).

This suggestive idea is explored further in Pruss's paper, 'A Traveling Forms Interpretation of Quantum Mechanics', in which he illuminates but doesn't actually resolve a number of concerns. So, for example, granted we have here a case of 'diachronic, horizontal causation' (p. 97) as the substantial form travels from branch to branch, when and on what basis does this form enter the picture with the result that a particular branch is selected? Restricting such forms to macroscopic entities raises obvious issues, but extending them to particles and fields clashes with other aspects of Aristotelian metaphysics (p. 116). And how should we understand the correlate of form, namely matter, in this picture? Should we identify that material correlate with the physical wavefunction as a whole? Those branches that are not selected would then correspond to 'formless chunks' of matter (p. 120) and again we get a conflict with traditional Aristotelianism since the physical wavefunction has definite properties and powers, whereas matter without form does not. In effect, by demanding the selection of one branch, the 'Travelling Forms' interpretation recapitulates the very concerns of the old 'collapse' solution to the measurement problem in quantum mechanics that the Everett interpretation sought to avoid.

All of the above essays deploy the notion of substantial form to tackle what might be seen as 'big themes', from the unity of organisms to the existence of time and determinate reality. The other papers in the volume are perhaps rather narrower in scope. Xavi Lanao and Nicholas Teh, for example, defend Cartwright's 'dappled' view of reality in 'Dodging the Fundamentalist Threat', arguing that it offers the kind of conceptual space that the hylomorphist needs in order to avoid the fundamentalist's reductive strategy. 'Half-Baked Humeanism' by William Simpson critiques Toby Handfield's attempt to preserve a form of Humean dispositionalism in the quantum context, and Tuomas Takho similarly invokes entanglement to attack Jonathan Schaffer's 'priority monism' in his 'Disentangling Nature's Joints'. Finally, moving back to the biological, Janice Chik Breidenbach's 'Action, Animacy and Substance Causation' adds a neo-Aristotelian gloss to the arguments of my colleague, Helen Steward, for the independent causal efficacy of animal agents. This last contribution is again illustrative as we are invited to get a grip on the relevant higher order organizing principle through a metaphor -- that of a whirlpool, which preserves its form, even though particular molecules of water enter and leave. The thing is, we know how a whirlpool works, thanks to fluid mechanics, and yet despite this and all the other suggestive examples, the reader may feel no closer to a similar understanding of 'substantial form'. Perhaps this is just the challenge we are faced with by all metaphysics, insofar as it goes beyond the broadly empirical, and certainly further comparisons of 'form' with the likes of 'structure' and 'process' may help shed light on the neo-Aristotelian project as a whole. This volume certainly offers a degree of illumination but as might be expected from such a disparate and wide-ranging collection, it comes only in brief and distinct flashes.