Neo-Kantianism in Contemporary Philosophy

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Rudolf A. Makkreel and Sebastian Luft (eds.), Neo-Kantianism in Contemporary Philosophy, Indiana University Press, 2009, 344pp., $32.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780253221445.

Reviewed by Andrew Chignell and Peter Gilgen, Cornell University


Quick: which philosophical movement was dominant in Europe between 1870 and 1914? Given the way that period is usually taught in philosophy departments, one could be forgiven for guessing "positivism," "Marxism," "existentialism," or even "pragmatism."

In fact, the correct answer is "Neo-Kantianism." Although not self-consciously a school, at least initially, the movement that came to be known by that name was -- by a long shot -- preeminent in Germany at the turn of the 20th century, and also very important in France, Italy, and even Russia. Moreover, Neo-Kantianism played a crucial role in the philosophical development of Husserl and Wittgenstein, Heidegger and Carnap, and was thus a condition of the schism that would characterize academic philosophy for the rest of the century.[1]

But what was Neo-Kantianism in itself, so to speak? The answer to this question is complex: there were multiple schools and sub-schools and no agreed-upon manifestos; even the "Marburg" vs. "Southwest" distinction covers up important contrasts and disputes. In their introduction to a collection of mostly new essays on the movement, Rudolf Makkreel and Sebastian Luft characterize the movement as united simply by "the express intention of reawakening the spirit of Kant's philosophy" in the post-Hegelian landscape. But what does that mean, exactly, and why would 19th century philosophers want to go back to Kant (instead of going back to, say, Hume, Locke, Descartes, or Aristotle)?

This story -- and the story of Neo-Kantianism's rise to prominence generally -- has been explored in some detail by Klaus Koehnke.[2] A quick answer is that it grew out of the dissatisfaction that mid-19th century European intellectuals felt with the speculative, romantic-metaphysical character of absolute idealism -- a dissatisfaction that didn't manifest itself across the English Channel until a few decades later. Early Neo-Kantians like Otto Liebmann and Kuno Fischer were trained in Germany, and so it was natural for them to look back to the origin of modern German thought (rather than to Hume, Aristotle, etc). Moreover, in Kant they found an opponent of the metaphysical excesses of Hegelianism and a defender of the natural sciences that were, by 1870, producing radically altered industrial, medical, and technological landscapes.

But what about the sudden collapse into obscurity? Why do the names of some of the most prominent Neo-Kantians -- Hermann Cohen, Paul Natorp, Heinrich Rickert, Emil Lask -- mean almost nothing to all but the most specialized historians of German philosophy? This part of the story of is even harder to tell with any real confidence. One thought is that after the Great War, a younger generation of intellectuals came to view anything affiliated with the bourgeois, imperialistic, and now defunct Kaiserreich as discredited. Although they had been trained in the Neo-Kantian tradition, they were ready for something new. Thus, the conditions were in place for a turn to the more apolitical programs of the Vienna Circle, or to the somewhat darker reinvigorations of Romanticism that were emanating from Freiburg.[3]

The recent renewal of interest in the origins of both analytic and Continental philosophy indicates that Neo-Kantianism is now worth revisiting. And the Makkreel/Luft volume will certainly help: the editors have brought together an impressive series of essays about this once-mighty tradition written by philosophers and historians of ideas on both sides of the great schism. Although the anthology is not in fact "the first of its kind to be published in English,"[4] it marks a substantial effort to retrieve what is still of interest in the Neo-Kantian movement.

What is most needed in this regard, however, is a collection of primary sources, critically edited and selected to give readers a sense of the hallmark doctrines and distinct methods of each school. Absent that, the hope expressed by Makkreel and Luft that the essays in this volume would result in a "renewed encounter with Neo-Kantianism . . . in North America" (3) or "secure Neo-Kantianism a significant place in contemporary philosophical discussions" seems a tad wishful (1).

For this reason, we were gratified to learn that Luft is now finishing an anthology of primary sources that will be published (from Routledge) as The Neo-Kantian Reader. Although we have delayed the present review in the hopes of including a detailed discussion of this reader, the release date has been repeatedly moved back (it's now September 2013). The table of contents suggests that this 450-page volume will finally make available to English-language readers some of the "greatest hits" of the Marburg, Southwest, and French Neo-Kantian schools. The volume will also include critiques of Neo-Kantianism by Husserl and Carnap, as well as texts relating to the legendary "Davos disputation" in 1929 between Cassirer and Heidegger that (allegedly) sealed the fate of Neo-Kantianism.

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The essays in Neo-Kantianism and Contemporary Philosophy include discussions of Neo-Kantian doctrines of intuition, perception, subjectivity, and transcendental philosophy generally, as well as accounts of the philosophy of science, ethics, and philosophy of religion defended by various leading figures. A couple of pieces, such as the one by Jürgen Stolzenberg, aim to settle technical debates within Neo-Kantian scholarship -- in this case regarding the nature of Hermann Cohen's philosophical method and the epistemological status of his appeal to the "fact of science" (a theoretical counterpart to Kant's appeal, in the Critique of Practical Reason, to the "fact of reason"). Quite a few essays draw contrasts between Neo-Kantianism and other early 20th century movements, such as phenomenology, positivism, hermeneutics, and Heideggerian existential philosophy. At least one, by Fabien Capeillères, offers a comprehensive picture (perhaps too comprehensive -- the paper runs to 60 printed pages) of the life and thought of the relatively unknown French Neo-Kantian, Émile Boutroux.

In our view, however, the most engaging essays are the ones that do what the title of the book promises -- namely, relate Neo-Kantianism to more familiar trends in contemporaryphilosophy. Michael Friedman's essay on Thomas Kuhn's debt to Ernst Cassirer stands out here, as does Steven Crowell's elegant account of Emil Lask's conception of truth and judgment as a predecessor of contemporary efforts (in Pittsburgh, primarily) to explode the so-called Myth of the Given.

Another contribution that succeeds in making a connection to contemporary philosophy -- this time in the continental context -- is Jean Grondin's essay on Hans-Georg Gadamer's Neo-Kantian heritage. Grondin points out that Gadamer was not a philosophical novice when he encountered Heidegger and came under his sway in 1923. On the contrary, over the preceding five years Gadamer had studied first with the Neo-Kantians Eugen Kühnemann and Richard Hönigswald in Breslau and then with Nicolai Hartmann and Paul Natorp (Gadamer's doctoral adviser) in Marburg. Grondin's interest is in tracking the lasting influences of this Neo-Kantian training on Gadamer's hermeneutics. In Truth and Method (1960), Gadamer points to critics of Neo-Kantianism -- Husserl, Dilthey, and Heidegger -- as his models. Elsewhere he identifies Neo-Kantianism with a narrow epistemological perspective that needed to be overcome -- a feat that, in his view, Heidegger had accomplished. Nonetheless, Grondin argues that Gadamer's insistence on the "validity claim" (98) of the human sciences, his reliance on a humanist understanding of culture, his interest in consciousness, his conception of the history of philosophy in terms of a "history of concepts" (Begriffsgeschichte) (102), and his view of language as "the unfolding of Being itself" (105), all bear undeniable traces of Neo-Kantian influence. In fact, Heidegger himself recognized (and criticized) Natorp's indelible imprint on his own foremost pupil -- an influence that Gadamer finally, in 1985, acknowledged as perhaps not entirely detrimental.

Rudolf Bernet's examination of what might be called the hermeneutics of perception in Cassirer, Heidegger, and Husserl is more historical. A novel philosophical hermeneutics arose in the early 20th century in response to questions concerning, for instance, the link between theoretical and practical philosophy or the increasing distance between the natural and the human sciences. Bernet rightly puts the dispute between Ernst Cassirer and Martin Heidegger that culminated in the Davos debate at the center of his discussion of this development. In his view, Cassirer was after "a hermeneutic of objective spirit" -- a project most fully executed in the volumes of his Philosophy of Symbolic Forms. Heidegger, in contrast, pursued a radical "hermeneutic of the finitude of Dasein" (41). Bernet's contribution expands the binary conflict between Cassirer and Heidegger into a tripartite configuration that also gives due attention to Husserl's phenomenology. By comparing and contrasting the three thinkers and placing them in the context of the dynamic rivalry between Neo-Kantianism and phenomenology, Bernet teases out numerous philosophical contributions and dependencies that have not received sufficient attention.

In another stimulating essay that explores the complex relations between Neo-Kantianism and phenomenology, Sebastian Luft reconstructs Natorp's profound influence on Husserl's "genetic" method and so-called "phenomenological reduction." Luft sees his contribution as a corrective to the "unhealthy tendency in Husserl scholarship" (61) to downplay most of the philosophical influences that Husserl adopted, with the exception of Brentano and his school. Indeed it was Heidegger who, in the Davos debate with Cassirer, claimed that even Husserl had fallen "into the clutches of neo-Kantianism between 1900 and 1910."[5] Luft shows that these earlier moments of contact actually turned into an embrace of Kantian and Neo-Kantian thinking from 1913 onward -- the date of the publication of Ideas I, which marks the inauguration of Husserl's so-called "transcendental turn."

Luft does this by sifting carefully through Natorp and Husserl's debates in their published works and their vast correspondence, and tracing their arguments concerning the status of transcendental philosophy and the proper method for the analysis of subjectivity. He arrives at the controversial conclusion that Husserl's transcendental turn in Ideas I was largely the result of his long engagement with Natorp. Both philosophers attempted to formulate a satisfactory theory of subjectivity taken in its concreteness. The central divide between Natorp's transcendental epistemology and Husserl's early phenomenology concerned the status of laws of cognition. Natorp, following Kant, interpreted them as a fixed and "formal a priori," whereas the phenomenologists were focused on more dynamic thought processes. Moreover, Natorp's transcendental account of consciousness was conceived "with regard to the object of cognition" (76). The actual relation of subject and object -- intentionality -- was not analyzed, and neither was the subject; in Natorp's psychology, which simply inverted the process of cognition, the subject was little more than an elusive or ideal "point." In contrast, Husserl's phenomenological "reduction" was meant to provide direct access to the subject as a living being rather than a mere apperceiver. Nevertheless, Natorp's influence continued to play a role in Husserl's development; this is clear from the fact that in his later work phenomenology becomes a genetic analysis of transcendental consciousness rather than individual psychology. On Luft's reading, then, Husserl's late work thus turns out to be at least as Neo-Kantian as it is phenomenological.

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The volume concludes with three essays on history, culture, and value. Originally published in 1969, Makkreel's own essay contains an informative juxtaposition of Wilhelm Dilthey's conception of the "human sciences" (Geisteswissenschaften), which included the humanities as well as the social sciences, and the alternative Neo-Kantian conception of "cultural sciences" (Kulturwissenschaften). Rejecting Hegelian speculative philosophy as well as Comte's sociological positivism, Dilthey concluded that the Geisteswissenschaften were concerned with modes of human existence and thus had their own distinct methodology -- in sharp contrast to the natural sciences. However, as Heinrich Rickert (one of the leading figures in the Southwest school) pointed out, the "Geist" in the name of these sciences could easily be mistaken for the notion of some supernatural reality or, alternatively, the psyche. Thus, the dangers of idealism and psychologism loomed large.

Rickert's alternative concept of culture and the Kulturwissenschaften as focused on "values" was designed to avoid these pitfalls. But according to Makkreel, Dilthey was not about to accept this full-blown Neo-Kantian separation of values and fact. Moreover, he refused to bracket psychology, to which he accorded the status of the most fundamental human science. The basic tenets of Dilthey's theory are captured in his most famous distinction: we explain nature, but we understand human life. And though explanation and understanding may indeed be "almost interchangeable" in some important respects, Makkreel seeks to vindicate Dilthey's concept of hermeneutics with its aim of understanding "the distinctive meaning of individual documents that cannot be derived from any readymade theory" (264).

In his essay on Hermann Cohen's ethics and philosophy of religion, Reiner Wiehl contends that Cohen's virtue theory is, paradoxically, "dated and quite contemporary at the same time" (272). Cohen's ethics, with its strong religious inflections, was intended as a more firmly grounded alternative to Kant. In light of recent interest in messianism and the problem of "futurity" in continental philosophy, his complex intertwining of "the ethical virtue of humanity and the religious virtue of peace," and his claim that they reach "beyond every factum of science toward a future humanity" (290) deserve renewed attention.

Finally, in a fitting conclusion to the volume, Massimo Ferrari points out that during his debate with Heidegger, Ernst Cassirer insisted that Neo-Kantianism be "determined functionally rather than substantially" and therefore "as a direction in question-posing" rather than a dogmatic system.[6] This statement guides Ferrari's inquiry into the question of whether Cassirer was actually a Neo-Kantian. In his multifarious investigations of scientific and cultural "facts" -- including language and myth -- Cassirer relied on the critical apparatus that had been developed by Cohen and Natorp, while expanding and transforming it at the same time. In particular, he appropriated Cohen's transcendental method, but in a more dynamic form that is attentive to history and the changing insights of the natural sciences (especially the theory of relativity). In this way, he took seriously Cohen's concept of a "developing fact" (Werdefaktum)[7] and came to the conclusion that transcendental philosophical inquiry (and critique) had to reexamine fundamental scientific concepts continuously -- a point that Friedman also emphasizes in his piece. Against Cohen, however, Cassirer pointed out that the transcendental method is limited neither to Newtonian science nor to the mathematical natural sciences at large. Rather, it applies to the entire cultural domain. Perhaps even from this short description it is apparent that the historical model for Cassirer's own philosophy of symbolic forms was -- as is sometimes claimed -- not Hegel's historical dialectic but rather Wilhelm von Humboldt's expansion of Kant's transcendental method to the field of language.

Although the value-oriented cultural science advocated by the Southwest Neo-Kantians like Rickert is addressed in Makkreel's contribution, a greater focus on such figures as Wilhelm Windelband and Jonas Cohn (the latter's contribution to the Southwest "critical science of value" took the form of an intriguing Allgemeine Ästhetik (universal aesthetics)) would have been useful in the concluding section on culture and value. A more significant omission concerns the philosophers of the Vienna circle and the Frankfurt school. Both groups are mentioned only in passing in the introduction. However, considering the collection's claim to contemporary significance, one might have expected a more sustained engagement with the early phase of analytic philosophy. Rudolf Carnap comes to mind here: he studied under the Neo-Kantian Bruno Bauch (himself a student of Rickert) and attended the Davos disputation. In fact, Luft plans to include part of Carnap's critique of Neo-Kantianism in the forthcoming reader. Likewise, the main representatives of Frankfurt-style Critical Theory, TheodorAdorno and Max Horkheimer, were students of the Neo-Kantian Hans Cornelius and continued to engage Kantian philosophy throughout their careers.[8]

These gaps notwithstanding, Makkreel and Luft's collection makes a strong case for reconsidering the significance of the contributions that Neo-Kantianism made to the history of philosophy, as well as to some of the important movements of our own era. Luft's welcome anthology of primary sources raises the probability that such a reconsideration will continue.

[1] For more of this story, see Peter Eli Gordon, Continental Divide: Heidegger, Cassirer, Davos. (Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 2010), Michael Friedman, The Parting of the Ways (Lasalle, IL: Open Court, 2000).

[2] See Klaus Christian Koehnke, The Rise of Neo-Kantianism: German Academic Philosophy Between Idealism and Positivism (New York: Cambridge University Press, 1991).

[3] See Peter Uwe Hohendahl, "The Crisis of Neo-Kantianism and the Reassessment of Kant after World War I," Philosophical Forum 41, 1-2, Spring/Summer 2010: 17-39.

[4] Makkreel and Luft begin their Introduction with the statement that "The present volume is the first of its kind to be published in English" (1). But the Summer 2008 edition ofPhilosophical Forum was devoted entirely to "Classical Neo-Kantianism" and contained essays by Rolf-Peter Horstmann, Paul Guyer, Dina Emundts, Michael Friedman, Frederick Beiser, Peter Gordon, and quite a few others (including the present reviewers) which relate the Neo-Kantian movement to various contemporary philosophical developments. The special edition was effectively the proceedings of the first of three conferences at Cornell on "The Legacy of Kant" (the other two conferences have been published by Philosophical Forum as well in Summer 2010 and Summer 2012). In fact, the essay by Michael Friedman in the Makkreel/Luft volume had already appeared in that Summer 2008 volume.

[5] See Martin Heidegger, Kant and the Problem of Metaphysics, trans. Richard Taft (Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1997; 5th, enlarged ed.), p. 193.

[6] The Davos debate is included as appendix IV in Martin Heidegger, Kant and the Problem of Metaphysics. Cassirer's remark occurs right at the opening of the exchange (193).

[7] Hermann Cohen, Logik der reinen Erkenntnis [=Werke, vol 6] (Hildesheim: Olms, 1977), 76, quoted in Ferrari (296).

[8] Some of these connections are explored in several contributions to Back to Kant II: The Fate of Kant in a Time of Crisis, a special edition of The Philosophical Forum 41 (2010), edited by Peter Gilgen, Peter Uwe Hohendahl, and Thomas Teufel.