Neo-Scholastic Essays

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Edward Feser, Neo-Scholastic Essays, St. Augustine's Press, 2015, 415pp., $26.00 (pbk), ISBN 9781587315589.

Reviewed by Travis Dumsday, Concordia University of Edmonton


This volume consists of sixteen essays (three of them previously unpublished) divided into four areas: Metaphysics and philosophy of nature; Natural theology; Philosophy of mind; and Ethics. Edward Feser writes as an historically informed Thomist who is also thoroughly conversant with the analytic tradition.

Since I cannot summarize the main lines of argument from each essay, I will do so only for those in the first two parts, which fall within my own areas of specialization. To give at least a preview of the remainder, I will provide brief thesis statements for the essays in the other two parts. Along the way I will make occasional evaluative remarks. Sharing as I do much of Feser's philosophical outlook, and writing as someone who has benefited from his work in my own thinking and teaching, I will focus on points of disagreement.

The first essay takes up the question of whether Aristotle's principle of motion (everything in motion requires a mover) conflicts with the Newtonian principle of inertia (a body at rest remains at rest unless acted on by an external force, and a body in a state of uniform motion in a straight line continues in that state unless acted on by an external force). The question is relevant to natural theology, as Aquinas' first way employs Aristotle's principle. Feser presents five arguments to the effect that the two principles are compatible.

First, there is no formal contradiction between them, insofar as the Newtonian says nothing of why objects in a state of uniform motion continue in that state unless acted upon. As such it does not, strictly speaking, rule out an external cause of some sort prompting the body's obedience to the principle. Ockham's razor might make one reluctant to entertain such a cause. The point is simply that there is no formal contradiction here even on the assumption that the two principles mean the same thing by 'motion.'

Second, they do not in fact mean the same thing by 'motion.' Newton's refers only to local motion, i.e., motion from one place to another. Aristotle means something broader: change in general, i.e., any actualization of a potentiality. Newtonian physics does not conceive of uniform local motion as involving the actualization of a potency -- in theory it could but in fact does not. Given this equivocation, there is no conflict.

Third, the Newtonian sees inertial 'motion' as a state, one that in fact involves the absence of any real change. On that conception, the Aristotelian can agree that no external cause is required.

Fourth, Aristotelian physics actually allows that objects can continue in uniform local motion absent the continuing intervention of an external cause. This occurs when the motion is grounded in the object's own substantial form. For instance, fire naturally moves upward, and will so move unless something inhibits it. No external cause prompts it to move upwards, unless one counts the external cause that brought the fire into being in the first place (thus granting this bit of prime matter the substantial form 'fire' and with it the corresponding natural activity). Some historians of science have in fact pointed to Aristotelian natural motion as a conceptual precursor to Newtonian inertia.

Fifth, Aristotelian natural philosophy and Newtonian science are addressing different domains: the former seeks underlying causes and natures, while the latter seeks merely the accurate mathematical description of observed regularities. As such they cannot conflict.

I would dispute that fifth point, at least when taken as a characterization of the aims of contemporary physicists. It smacks of the anti-realist perspective that remains far too prevalent in analytic philosophy of science; in fact physicists are typically after underlying causes and real natures, not merely mathematical description and accurate prediction. For better or worse, Scholastic philosophy of nature and the natural sciences constitute partially overlapping magisteria. (Elsewhere in this volume Feser seems to turn away from scientific anti-realism; see especially his approving comments concerning the work of Nancy Cartwright on 82, 191, and 328. There is a tension here. However, in Feser's most in-depth discussion of the disciplinary boundaries of physics (Scholastic Metaphysics 2014, 12-18) the tendency is again toward anti-realism, or at best a version of structural realism.)

Having argued that the Aristotelian and Newtonian principles are compatible, Feser proceeds to examine how Scholastics ought to think of the ontology of inertia, laying out three options. (A) If inertial motion really involves change (i.e., actualization of potency), then in the absence of any internal or external physical cause of change there must be a non-physical cause, however much that idea will be resisted by metaphysical naturalists. (B) If inertial 'motion' does not really involve change, then the Aristotelian qua Aristotelian needn't address it as a distinct topic -- philosophy of nature examines the underlying principles of change. Feser notes that on this option Aquinas' first way can still function and can even function on the basis of local motion, though in that case it will have to be formulated specifically in terms of acceleration rather than uniform motion. (C) One could view the whole issue as moot since general relativity presents us with a four-dimensional world devoid of any real change. Feser is skeptical of this construal of the metaphysics of relativity, but even granting it, change would not be wholly eliminated but simply relocated from the physical realm to the mental (i.e., changes in consciousness). Since the first way can be run on mental change, natural theology is again no worse off.

"Teleology: A Shopper's Guide" lays out a taxonomy of differing conceptions of teleology, thereby highlighting a contrast between the Thomistic conception and one commonly employed within the intelligent design movement.

Feser first draws a parallel between the debate over the ontology of universals and the debate over teleology. There are five main positions concerning the former: nominalism, conceptualism, Platonic realism, Aristotelian realism, and Scholastic realism. There are five comparable positions concerning the latter: teleological eliminativism is the view that there is no teleology; teleological reductionism is the view that there is teleology (for instance in biological functions) but that it is reducible to non-teleological phenomena; in Platonic teleological realism the idea is that there are real purposes to natural objects, but these purposes are extrinsic to those objects (probably residing in the mind of a transcendent divinity); in Aristotelian teleological realism there are real purposes to natural objects, and those purposes are immanent; finally, in Scholastic teleological realism there are likewise purposes immanent in objects, but those purposes must ultimately be grounded in an external divine mind.

The taxonomy becomes further complicated in that there are various potential domains of teleology, various levels of nature in which the objective reality of purpose has been proposed: the level of basic causal regularities (ends residing even in the fundamental causal powers of elementary particles); complex inorganic processes (e.g., the water cycle); basic biological phenomena; animal life; and human thought and action.

With those distinctions in place, a range of resulting views can arise; one could for instance be a teleological eliminativist about every level, as are many naturalists; or one could be a teleological eliminativist with respect to basic causal regularities and complex inorganic processes, but a Platonic teleological realist about the higher levels. Feser suggests this latter view was the one actually adopted by Paley and still employed by much of the intelligent design movement. He contrasts it with the Scholastic view, according to which there is genuine teleology at each level, permitting a teleological argument for theism to be made even from the most basic causal regularities. Feser's goal here is not to defend the Scholastic position but to explain why contemporary Scholastics have often been wary of the arguments coming out of the intelligent design movement: those arguments generally assume a conflicting metaphysics of teleology.

That essay, originally published in Philosophia Christi,, was critiqued there by Marie George. Feser counter-replies in "On Aristotle, Aquinas, and Paley: A Reply to Marie George." He clears up conceptual and interpretive points raised by George. The most interesting portion of this essay revolves around a passage in Aristotle's On Generation and Corruption that George reads as indicating Aristotle allowed for the divine implanting of ends in material objects. Feser plausibly disputes the reading, but the issue could profitably have received further discussion. (The passage is brought up in a later essay, on 158, but the same points are reiterated.)

"Natural Theology Must be Grounded in the Philosophy of Nature, Not in Natural Science" develops the thesis that the Scholastic ontology of act and potency constitutes the only adequate basis for sound a posteriori arguments in favour of classical theism. The Scholastic real distinction between potency and act -- recapitulated at the level of properties (causal powers vs. their manifestation), material substances (prime matter vs. substantial form), and finite substances in general (essence vs. existence) -- entails that finite substances require an external self-subsistent Cause to preserve them in being. Feser clearly lays out in premise/conclusion form a relevant sample cosmological argument on 64-65. He then goes on to argue that natural theology in the early modern period succumbed to Humean and Kantian critiques because it abandoned Scholastic philosophy of nature in favour of a mechanistic ontology. Natural theology must return to Scholasticism, and today that return has been made easier by the revival of Scholastic-like positions in analytic metaphysics and philosophy of science, notably dispositionalism and scientific essentialism.

While I agree with Feser on the distinctive strengths of a natural theology rooted in Scholastic philosophy of nature, he is too hard on early modern mechanistic thought and its contemporary analogues. As Robert Boyle and others pointed out at the time, certain cosmological arguments can actually be run more simply on an ontology of corpuscularianism + extrinsic governing laws than on hylomorphism. (And contra Feser, these needn't be seen as leading no further than a desiccated deism -- there are potential routes to classical theism here.) Further, the early modern switch from an Aristotelian conception of time as merely the measure of motion to time as a real background condition provided fuel for new cosmological arguments unavailable to Scholastics (e.g., the argument that the persistence of the temporal stream itself requires an extrinsic sustaining cause). And the core Thomistic argument from the real distinction between essence and existence in finite substances can be run on any philosophy of nature. (Admittedly that last claim would require considerable elaboration, including development of the arguably un-Thomistic idea that the essence vs. existence distinction needn't be formulated in terms of potency vs. act.) Ultimately, the best strategy for contemporary natural theology is disjunctive: point out that there are good arguments for classical theism available on all the major philosophies of nature (corpuscularian or hylomorphic or Humean . . . .), even the ones that Scholastics rightly deem implausible.

The next two essays expand on and further defend the sort of Scholastic cosmological argument briefly laid out in the previous piece (64-65). In "Existential Inertia and the Five Ways" Feser takes the act vs. potency and essence vs. existence distinction as the interpretive key to understanding Aquinas' five ways. He provides clear summaries of each (again in helpful premise/conclusion form) and plausibly defends his interpretation against alternative readings. In "The New Atheists and the Cosmological Argument" Feser first provides a takedown of recent misreadings of the cosmological argument then concisely summarizes several different historically prominent versions of the argument (the Aristotelian, Plotinian, Leibnizian, and Kalam). He concludes by rebutting six objections that appear in the new atheist literature.

The teleological argument again comes under scrutiny in "Between Aristotle and William Paley: Aquinas's Fifth Way." Feser draws out in further detail an idea raised in earlier essays: that the Scholastic teleology on display in Aquinas' fifth way constitutes something of a middle position between Aristotelian teleology (in which there are real purposes in nature but they are purely immanent in things) and Paley's (in which purpose remains purely extrinsic, residing solely in the mind of God). Scholastic teleology involves immanent purpose that has an ultimately extrinsic source, thus incorporating elements contained in the teleologies of both Aristotle and Paley. Feser also defends in greater detail the key claim that purpose is evident even in the most basic causal processes in nature, insofar as all efficient causation presupposes final causation. I.e., all causal powers are powers to do something and as such are essentially oriented to a state of affairs that does not currently exist in the material world, but which state of affairs must be real in some sense insofar as it figures in a real relation. The Platonist can see this as indicating that the causal power is oriented to a transcendent, independently real Form (or set of Forms). The Scholastic, who rejects independent Platonic abstracta, must say that the causal power is oriented to an idea in the divine mind.

In "Why McGinn is a Pre-Theist" Feser responds to an article in which Colin McGinn argued that atheism is more reasonable than monotheism in part because it is simpler, and indeed merely an extension of monotheism. After all, monotheists believe in their own god but reject everyone else's (the gods of assorted polytheisms for instance), whereas the atheist merely takes it one step further by rejecting all gods. Feser notes that McGinn is here embroiled in a category mistake, assuming that the gods of Greek polytheism (for instance) are the same sorts of thing as the God of classical theism (neo-Platonic, Jewish, Christian etc.). But this is erroneous; God is not just a souped-up Athena (or Great Pumpkin) but Being-qua-Being and the transcendent Source of all finite realities. Atheist philosophers need to articulate carefully what it is that they are rejecting, lest they reject something that no informed monotheist takes seriously anyway. (Feser is making a point later developed by Orthodox theologian David Bentley Hart in The Experience of God.)

In "The Road from Atheism," Feser describes his intellectual conversion. It constitutes a nice counter-example to those (including many theologians) who denigrate or downplay the importance of natural theology in people's actual religious lives. For Feser, natural theology, and especially the natural theology of the Scholastic tradition, played a crucial role in returning to theism.

I will now summarize the theses defended in the volume's last two parts. In "Kripke, Ross, and the Immaterial Aspects of Thought," Feser provides a defence of James Ross' argument for the irreducible immateriality of certain mental processes. "Hayek, Popper, and the Causal Theory of the Mind" examines Karl Popper's critique of Friedrich Hayek's version of physicalism. The thesis of "Why Searle is a Property Dualist" is obvious from the title. In "Being, the Good, and the Guise of the Good" Feser defends the traditional Thomistic position on the relationship between being and goodness (namely that they differ in sense but are ultimately identical in reference). "Classical Natural Law Theory, Property Rights, and Taxation" similarly defends the Thomistic perspective on those issues. In "Self-Ownership, Libertarianism, and Impartiality" Feser critically examines the claim that libertarianism supports the Rawlsian vision of political neutrality. The final essay, "In Defense of the Perverted Faculty Argument," takes up a long-running dispute between advocates of traditional Thomistic ethics and advocates of the so-called 'new' natural law theory, taking the side of the former.

By way of a concluding remark, I'll observe that this volume nicely exhibits Feser's clear writing style and uncommonly strong facility with both the Scholastic and analytic traditions. Those of us attempting to integrate these traditions can profit from his example.