Neoplatonism and the Philosophy of Nature

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James Wilberding and Christoph Horn (eds.), Neoplatonism and the Philosophy of Nature, Oxford University Press, 2012, 280pp., $75.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199693719.

Reviewed by Pantelis Golitsis, Freie Universität, Berlin


According to a long-lasting prejudice, which the two editors of this book trace back to Eduard Zeller's widely influential Philosophie der Griechen in ihrer geschichtlichen Entwicklung, natural philosophy did not interest Plotinus and his followers. This was because those 'otherworldly Neoplatonists' directed their philosophical efforts at understanding not nature and sensible change but the self-moving Soul, the unchangeable Intellect and the One. Zeller's content-header ('keine naturwissenschaftliche Forschung') does not concern the philosophy of nature but rather the natural or empirical sciences ('Erforschung der physikalischen Gesetze'), the relative absence of which from Neoplatonic endeavours can be explained by Neoplatonism's belatedness in the history of science and philosophy (several natural sciences having gained by then their autonomy and being only theoretically dependent upon philosophy).[1]  But James Wilberding and Christoph Horn are absolutely right when they claim in their introduction that 'Neoplatonic thinkers have valuable things to say on the philosophy of nature'.

A conference on this topic was hosted by the University of Bonn in June 2007, where the contributors to this volume first presented their papers. The volume has two parts: Part I includes papers that deal with 'The General Metaphysics of Nature', while the papers of Part II tackle various 'Platonic Approaches to Individual Sciences'. I shall briefly present and comment on each contribution, before turning to some more general comments about the content and the structure of the volume.

Lloyd P. Gerson ('Plotinus on Logos') examines the implication of Plotinus' metaphysics, specifically of his thesis that 'a lower principle is a logos of a higher', for his philosophy of nature. Gerson takes that to mean, roughly, that x (the higher principle) is virtually y (the lower principle), whereby y is equivalent to the 'external activity' of x, or to the 'actualization of x that is really distinct from x'. In this manner, a logos-hierarchy is established within the three Plotinian hypostases, to which an instrumental causality is linked: the Intellect is the expression and instrument of the One, the Soul is the expression and instrument of the Intellect and (in a different way) of the One, and nature (which is no hypostasis but the lowest part of Soul) is the expression and instrument of the Soul and (in a different way) of the Intellect and of the One. To put it in a nutshell, nature is the logos of Soul, which brings intelligibility to matter, i.e., figure (morphê, rendered by Gerson as 'shape').

I find Gerson's interpretation very compelling, although I failed to understand his reading of Enn. III 8, 2.30-35:

The logos, then, which is in the visible shape, is the last one, and as such is dead and no longer able to produce another, whereas that which has life is the brother of the one which produces the shape, and it produces in that which comes to be the identical power that it has.

Gerson seems to imply that 'that which has life' and its 'brother' are the individual soul of the living being and the soul of the universe. It seems to me, however, that the 'last and dead logos' is the enmattered form (the Aristotelian enulon eidos), while that which produces the visible shape (the morphê) is nature and her brother, 'who has life', is the vegetative soul. This reading can find some support in another passage quoted by Gerson, namely Enn. II 3, 17.1-7, which has been inadequately understood, where Plotinus says that 'there [is] something different (sc. from nature) which imparts to the product of nature the power to grow and to generate'. That is, in my reading, the vegetative soul.

Andrew Smith ('The Significance of "physics" in Porphyry: The Problem of Body and Matter') mainly discusses Porphyry's conception of the origin of matter and of its relation to the disordered and ordered body. Smith identifies the first as the four elements in disorderly motion (according to Tim. 30a 4-5) and the second as the cosmos. He is less clear about the Porphyrian origin of matter, seeming to hesitate between the One (a view to which Proclus was later committed) and the Intellect. Be that as it may, Smith pertinently points out that Porphyry's overriding concern in his physics is the defence of monism and the rejection of a temporal creation of the universe.

Stephen Menn ('Self-Motion and Reflection: Hermias and Proclus on the Harmony of Plato and Aristotle on the Soul') takes Hermias' report of Syrianus' reading of Phaedrus, 245c 5 ('all soul is immortal', where 'all soul' means 'every rational soul') as his starting point. He gives an excellent account of the Late Neoplatonists' understanding of the soul's self-motion, which is meant as self-reversion through rational self-thinking, or, following Aristotle's representation of it, as bending-back (katakampsis) of a straight line into a circle, a metaphor which was to lead to the medieval reflexio. Menn's paper also contains important correctives to received opinions in the scholarly literature. For example, although the Neoplatonists are said to have held that Plato was more high-minded than Aristotle, Menn shows that in a way the contrary was true. Menn also provides insight into the deeper meaning of Neoplatonist harmonization as philosophical understanding of the tensions between Plato and Aristotle.

In a long and learned paper, Alain Lernould ('Nature in Proclus: From Irrational Immanent Principle to Goddess') scrutinizes Proclus' digression on Nature in his commentary on Plato's Timaeus, in light of some parallel texts. As he shows, Proclus saw nature as the middle term in a triad '(enmattered) forms -- nature -- sensation', which reflects the (intelligible) triad 'Being -- Life -- Intellect'. At the same time, he allowed Nature, as a Henad, to be a Goddess. But I cannot agree with Lernould's claim, partly based on Thomas Taylor's reading of In Tim. I, 386.16-18, that Nature as a Goddess also produces matter without qualification. Nature is said by Proclus to produce matter according to its very existence (kata tên heautês huparxin); in other words, universal Nature allows matter to exist (or to be) through enmattered natural forms.

With Christia Mercer ('Platonism in Early Modern Natural Philosophy: The Case of Leibniz and Conway') we pass from Proclus, somewhat suddenly, to early modern philosophy. Mercer's paper is very informative and its abandoning the conventional limits of Neoplatonism happily surprises the reader. It is based, however, on a loose sense of Platonism as a set of doctrines which she identifies as the 'supreme being', 'emanation and hierarchy', 'cosmic unity', 'harmonized plenitude and enhancement' and, a bit surprisingly, 'souls'. I am committed to a strict sense of Platonism, according to which a Platonist is someone who develops a philosophical discourse based on Plato's own writings and/or explicitly seeks to defend Plato. As a result, I am not convinced of Leibniz's or Conway's Platonism. On the basis of texts quoted by Mercer (see, for instance, p. 118 n. 45, where Leibniz says that he wishes to unite with his system 'Plato with Democritus, Aristotle with Descartes, the Scholastics with the moderns', or p. 119 n. 49, where he appeals to Plato, Aristotle, the Stoics, Averroes, Fracastoro and Fernel), I think that these philosophers would be better described as 'conciliatory eclectics'. Leibniz's statement that 'Dieu est le soleil et la lumière des âmes, lumen illuminans omnem hominem venientem in hunc mundum', which Mercer assimilates to 'the Platonist image of the sun' (p. 122), is, of course, an allusion to Saint John's Gospel (1.9).

The late Ian Mueller's 'Aristotelian Objections and Post-Aristotelian Responses to Plato's Elemental Theory' begins the second part of the book. Mueller discusses very helpfully Simplicius' agreements and disagreements with Proclus about the fifteen objections raised by Aristotle against Plato's elemental theory in the third book of the De caelo. Nonetheless, he somewhat misconstrues Simplicius' resolution of the sixth objection, according to which only two of Plato's four regular solids, namely the pyramid (of which fire is composed) and the cube (of which earth is composed) can be assembled in such a way as to leave no empty space. Consequently, one has to admit that void is interspersed in air and water, which are respectively composed of octahedra and icosahedra. This being a bad consequence (for Aristotelians and Platonists alike), Proclus tried to avoid it by claiming that the spaces remaining in the combining of octahedra are filled up with pyramids, while those remaining in the combining of icosahedra are filled up with octahedra (and pyramids). As Mueller rightly remarks, Proclus' unproved solution did not satisfy Simplicius. But contrary to what Mueller claims, I think thatSimplicius does better than his predecessor. He points out that this problem is also pertinent for the (solid) cube's being 'filled up' with four (plane) squares, and for the (solid) pyramid's being 'filled up' with four (plane) triangles, and appeals to Tim. 57c to argue that the most elemental entities are not mathematical planes but physical, three-dimensional triangles of various sizes; the smallest of them, which are supposed to be everywhere, fill out the interstitial void.

Jan Opsomer ('In Defence of Geometric Atomism: Explaining Elemental Properties') tackles the importance that Neoplatonists laid on the hylomorphic structure of the elementary triangles. He also offers a particularly illuminating account of the Neoplatonist construal of Plato's 'geometric atomism', as it is nowadays called. Opsomer shows how, according to Proclus and to Simplicius, 'shaped quantities', that is, three-dimensional triangles and polyhedra, which are received by the qualityless body (the traditional 'second substrate' of physical reality), determine the qualitative differences of the traditional four elements. Simplicius brands this a 'Pythagorean' interpretation of the elemental theory of the Timaeus, to which he opposes a misleading 'Aristotelianizing' one, which held that the true principles that determine the qualityless body are not 'shaped quantities' but 'affective qualities', that is, heat, dryness and their opposites. Opsomer interestingly links the mysterious Pericles of Lydia to that last interpretation.

With Carlos Steel ('Plato's Geography: Damascius' Interpretation of the Phaedo Myth') we move to a fascinating analysis of Damascius' (and Proclus') understanding of the description of the earth that Socrates gives in the Phaedo. The Neoplatonists sorted out four problems related to that issue: the position of the earth, its spherical shape, its stability and its size. Steel shows how Proclus and Damasciussided with Socrates' imaginary description (of earth's having, for instance, an immense size and of people's inhabiting only hollows of it) against the calculations of scientific geographers and cosmologists, such as Eratosthenes, Ptolemy and Cleomedes. Both scientists and philosophers were nonetheless together in defending the earth's sphericity, that is, its beauty and its perfectness.

In a most interesting albeit historically somewhat loose study, James Wilberding ('Neoplatonists on "Spontaneous' Generation"') analyzes the general Neoplatonic theory of 'abiogenesis', that is, the generation of living things from non-living things, such as hornets from dead horses or bees from dead cows. Wilberding convincingly shows that Neoplatonists explained such spontaneous generation by presupposing a pre-existing soul, namely the vegetative soul of the deceased animal, which provided form-principles to a suitable receptacle-body. Wilberding basically relies on Philoponus' account (actually a recording of his teacher Ammonius' account; Ammonius is similarly behind Asclepius' commentary on the Metaphysics, to which Wilberding also appeals), who brought together two apparently different phenomena, namely the 'abiogenesis', ascribed by Ammonius' teacher Proclus to the vegetative soul of the Earth, and what one might describe as 'soulless life' for a short time, like the 'life' of hair or nails that continue to grow on corpses, which Ammonius attributed to the vegetative soul of the single organism.

Finally, Christoph Horn ('Aspects of Biology in Plotinus') deals with Plotinus' account of life as a unifying force of activity, which stems from the 'perfect, true and real life' of the Intellect and is centredupon three features (that are also basic features of organic life): self-preservation, self-organization and self-motion. Horn further argues that Plotinus' effort was to preserve Platonist psycho-physicaldualism against Aristotelian hylomorphism.

The book covers, then, several topics in natural philosophy, ranging from the philosophy of the soul to elemental physics and to theories of spontaneous generation. Some striking omissions, such as Neoplatonist meteorology, can be perhaps justified on the grounds that not every topic is expected to be treated in any single volume. In light of the book's contents, however, the absence of a study devoted to Simplicius' digression on nature in his commentary on the Physics seems less justifiable. Including it would have made it possible, for instance, to enrich Wilberding's discussion, since Simplicius ascribes the (passive) phenomenon of 'soulless life' to nature (see In Phys. 287.13-23). Similarly, taking into consideration Philoponus' elaborate definition of nature as 'life or power plunged into the bodies, forming and governing them' (In Phys. 197.34-35), which via Ammonius goes back to Proclus and to Plotinus, would have given a more complete picture of the philosophy of nature in Neoplatonism, and of its evolution.

I also think that the uniformity of volume, which is laudable in light of its conference origin, is somewhat undermined by its twofold structure, which ultimately depends on the (unsafe) assumption of interchangeability between the terms 'natural philosophy' and 'philosophy of nature'. To my mind at least, the latter (to which, for example, Proclus' and Simplicius' digressions, or Plotinus' Enn. III 8, or even Aristotle' Physics II 1, are devoted) is included in the more generic 'natural philosophy'. I cannot see, for instance, in what way Horn's essay, which deals with Plotinus' philosophy of biology, is more specific than Gerson's or Lernould's contributions, which treat Plotinus' and Proclus' philosophy of nature, or in what sense Mueller's or Opsomer's chapters, which examine the transformation of qualityless body to cosmos, are more 'individual' than Smith's.

I should add, finally, that I have counted about twenty typos, some of them in Greek.[2]

Despite such criticisms, the reading of Neoplatonism and the Philosophy of Nature is undoubtedly a rewarding one. It is a valuable addition towards understanding the Erscheinungswelt of the Neoplatonists.

[1] This is illustrated, for instance, by Simplicius's introduction to his commentary on the Physics, where he says (4.17-20) that 'natural philosophy (phusiologia) . . . provides medicine, mechanics and other arts that need to know the nature and the natural differences of the subject-matter they examine with their principles'. Also, it has to be noted in favour of Zeller's thesis that the Neoplatonists, while they knew of Aristotle's psycho-physiological and more empirical treatises (such as the Historia animalium), excluded them from their curriculum: see their introductions to Aristotle's philosophy and to his four 'theoretical' physical treatises (PhysicsDe caeloDe generatione et corruptioneMeteorologica).

[2] In p. 210 n. 43, for instance, we read συνεκτωα for συνεκτικά,πολό for πολύ, σονεργά for συνεργά. ὕλη κεκοσμένη, which appears two times in p. 34-35, should be ὕλη κεκοσμημένη; instead of αὐτόῦπου (p. 78) lege αὐτοῦ καὶ; instead of αἰνιττόμενυς (p. 176) lege αἰνιττόμενος; instead of θεωρητιυός (p. 217) lege θεωρητικός.