Neural Basis of Free Will: Criterial Causation

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Peter Ulric Tse, Neural Basis of Free Will: Criterial Causation, MIT Press, 2013, 456pp., $38.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780262019101.

Reviewed by Robert C. Bishop, Wheaton College


My physics teacher, John Wheeler, would often say, "Philosophy is too important to leave to the philosophers." He meant that philosophy engages important questions (What's an object? What's a measurement?), but that philosophers often lacked detailed knowledge of physics and other sciences important to addressing those questions. So Wheeler encouraged physicists and other scientists to help out the philosophers.

Peter Ulric Tse, is a neuroscientist who can be seen as answering Wheeler's call to action. Tse seeks to bring neuroscience to bear on questions concerning mental causation and free will. Much of his book is devoted to explaining the neurophysiology and neuroscience of the brain, giving some fairly user-friendly descriptions of the neural mechanisms that underpin his account of mental causation and free will. Readers from outside neuroscience will be able to learn much about the details of neurons, neural networks and some of the empirical studies that inform neuroscience along with Tse's rather novel account of mental causation and free will. He has also included a very extensive glossary of terms which readers will find very helpful.

At the heart of Tse's account is criterial causation. Criteria, for Tse, are "conditions on input that can be met in multiple ways and to differing degrees" (p. 292). An example of such conditions might be standards for fuel efficiency when shopping for a new car. Sally might have a fuel efficiency rating criterion in mind for her car purchase, but her target can be met in a variety of ways (e.g., small gasoline engine, electric/gasoline hybrid, or diesel engine). Criterial causation, then,

involves a succession of criterial assessments of physically realized informational input that transforms, completes, and manipulates that information. Among neurons, informational criterial assessments are realized in physical assessments of intracellular potential that, when satisfied, release a physical change that can carry information for a subsequent stage of decoding. (p. 292)

There is a one-to-many relationship between input and output (e.g., different ways a fuel efficiency target might be satisfied in the decision to buy a car).

With this notion of causation in place, Tse offers a three-stage model for mental causation (p. 25): (1) when neurons are processing information at time t1, they set new informational criteria which subsequent inputs must meet to trigger firing (resetting the effective inputs for postsynaptic neurons); (2) the inputs arriving at a later time t2 are variable reflecting a randomness that Tse argues is often ontological; (3) when these inputs arrive at a postsynaptic neuron at a later time t3, they either meet the previously set informational criteria or not; consequently, postsynaptic neurons either fire or not. Tse allows randomness to play some role in stages (1) and (2), but not in stage (3) since "intracellular potential either passes the threshold for firing or it does not" (p. 25). So firing is an all or nothing affair, while randomness can affect the next setting of the informational criteria to be met as well as contribute to the variability in inputs. Information is physically realized, onTse's so some physically-realized mental event can lead to neurons resetting the criterial triggers that future input must meet, meaning that the "code" for future firing is set in the present. "Any future input that satisfies these new criteria will lead to a response that will in turn either lead to a physical action or a change in how information even further in the future will occur by again changing criteria for neuronal firing" (p. 25).

How does this view of mental causation work out in Sally's car purchase? Age, rising fuel costs and other informational inputs related to her current car cause mental events that lead to neurons setting criterial targets for a new car. Sally begins pondering the purchase of a new car with fuel economy as her chief decision point. Pondering the purchase of a new car, arriving at a crucial decision point, and so forth, are mental events that lead to Sally's neurons further resetting criterial targets. She starts looking at car ads, reading Consumer Reports and engaging in online research. These informational inputs lead to various criterial targets being satisfied, which, in turn, leads to neurons setting new criterial targets. Eventually, a particular compact hybrid satisfies the full set of previously established criterial targets, and Sally decides to purchase a new car. At each stage in her search, the information input changes, but her neurons both respond to this changing input and transform that information in the form of setting new criterial targets future input must meet. So at each stage in the car purchase process, not only does the information change, but the criterial targets also change. In this sense, Tse argues that information is causal.

The neuronal setting and resetting of criterial targets "can either be driven volitionally or nonvolitionally, depending on the neural circuitry involved" (p. 25). This leads to Tse's account of free will. He starts by defining four features for "strong free will":

We must have (a) multiple courses of physical or mental behavior open to us; (b) we must really be able to choose among them; (c) we must be or must have been able to have chosen otherwise once we have chosen a course of behavior; and (d) the choice must not be dictated by randomness alone, but by us. (pp. 133-134)

Anyone familiar with free will debates will immediately recognize that Tse's strong free will is libertarian (e.g., Kane 1996). The twist for Tse's account comes in the use of criterial causation. The present criteria Sally uses to evaluate car purchase options are fixed just prior to any new information input, so the current ad she's reading will either meet the current criterial triggers or not, and she will respond to the new information in the ad in accordance with those criterial triggers. However, as her neurons assess this new information, according to current criterial triggers, they can voluntarily reset those triggers for future information input. Sally's freedom lies in this fact: while she cannot reshape her previously set criteria at this moment in time, through the three stages of criterial causation she can determine how to reset criterial triggers for how her neurons will respond to future information. "Criterial causation therefore offers a path toward free will where the brain can determine how it will behave given particular types of future input. This input can be milliseconds in the future or, in some cases, even years away" (p. 136). Moreover, since Sally's criterial targets can be met by a variety of differing inputs, and given that there is always some "noise," some variability in neuronal activity, "the timing and particulars of an outcome of a criterial decision are neither predetermined nor random" (p. 136).

So on Tse's account, conditions (a)-(d) are not met by the current response to current input, but by the brain's capacity to set criterial triggers for response to future input.

Any criterial outcome will meet the criteria preset by a given brain, and so will be an outcome that is satisfactory to that brain and caused by that brain, but it will also not be a unique solution predetermined by that brain or coerced upon that brain by external factors. (p. 137)

Consider Tse's example of Mozart. Suppose Mozart is trying to write a musical sequence that sounds happy. "Some part of his brain . . . defines criteria that a melody would have to meet in order to sound happy" (p. 137). But, there are various ways in which the criterial targets for happy musical sequences can be met. These possible sequences "are 'presented' to Mozart's executive system" which either accepts or rejects them, "whereupon lower level systems continue to generate possible solutions to the problem" (p. 137). Whatever musical sequence ultimately gets selected will sound to us like Mozart "because it satisfied the criterial decoding schemes that were unique to his brain" (p. 137).

If we were to replay the scene again, a different musical sequence might have been generated and selected since there are a variety of sequences that would match Mozart's criteria:

None of his pieces of music was predestined to sound as it did, and each piece could have turned out otherwise, although any piece that met his criteria would have sounded like a piece by Mozart. He could not help but have his style because he could not help but instantiate criteria that would satisfy Mozart, because he was Mozart, with his nervous system. Criterialcausal systems, like Mozart's brain, can thus harness randomness to generate novel and creative solutions. (p. 137)

Mozart's executive system "could further edit" any of the musical sequences presented by "lower-level, nonexecutive systems," or reject them. Mozart's strong free will satisfies (a)-(d) since through

the setting up of physically realized criteria in advance for behaving a certain way given certain types of future input . . . the nervous system can now change the physical grounds for making a future choice by setting up criterial decoders that then wait for relevant input that will meet those criteria. (p. 138)

One of the virtues Tse claims for his account is that it dodges the problem of self-causation as articulated by Galen Strawson:

(1) Your physical/mental organization determines your response to input.

(2) To be ultimately responsible for your actions is to be ultimately responsible for your physical/mental organization.

(3) However, you cannot be ultimately responsible for your physical/mental organization when making a choice now because you currently are what you are when making your choice now.

(4) To choose a different physical/mental organization so that you could make a different choice requires an act of self-causation, which is logically impossible.

(5) Therefore, you cannot help but choose what you choose at this moment, so you are not ultimately responsible for what you do.

Tse considers this "impossibility of self-causation" to be "a valid argument against the possibility of an ability to choose the present grounds for making a present choice" (p. 135). In contrast, since neurons can currently reset criterial triggers for response to future inputs, Tse argues that his version of strong free will avoids the self-causation problem, hence, escapes Strawson'sreasoning.

This is a reasonable model for mental causation and free will, but does it work and will it satisfy what philosophers have been arguing about for centuries? If one takes the blurbs of Tse's book by neuroscientists such as Christof Koch seriously, the answer seems to be "Yes." But there are reasons to doubt this interesting account.

The first reason is that Tse's account depends on numerous equivocations. Recall his characterization of strong free will above. Notice that all of these characteristics are cast in terms of "we" or "us" -- references to persons. The standard vocabulary used to describe free will, such as "considering," "deliberating," "reasoning," "choosing," "deciding," and so forth, are predicates applicable to persons. However, what Tse means by "choosing," "deciding," "we" and "us" is neural circuits and brains. In other words, Tse uses the language of persons while his intended referent is neurons and brains. This is explicit in his Mozart example, where we have language applicable to Mozart as a person, but an identification of Mozart with a brain.[1] Let's call this the personification equivocation.

Criteria are standards for or means of judging or deciding. Judgement and decision, in turn, are quintessential human capacities. So when Tse speaks of neurons as having criteria -- "a set of conditions on input that can be met in multiple ways and to different degrees" (p. 22) -- he commits the personification equivocation. In making a decision about what car to buy, Sally "must weigh the different criterial fulfillments against each other and assess aggregate criterial fulfillment" (p. 23). Similarly, "Neurons criterially assess incoming information . . . Neurons assess the degree to which inputs possess informational attributes because they assess the degree to which corresponding physical facts are met" (pp.23-24, emphasis added). Here, a quintessential human capacity -- assessment -- is attributed to neurons.

What actually is "assessment" for neurons? "The passage of a potential threshold triggers neurons to do certain things, like fire, or generate dendritic action potentials when certain physical conditions are met" (p. 24). But Tse has already set the language of criteria and assessment up so that there is an ambiguity between the low-level neurophysiological processes and quintessential human capacities and powers. (One can almost see some form of panpsychism, here, where rudimentary consciousness and rationality are at work along with the physical features of neurons, but this clearly isn't what Tse intends). For example, we might say that "Sally bought the car because the fuel economy is so good." However, according to Tse, "this higher-level propositional causation has to be realized in criterial causation at the neuronal level. Since there are only cells in our brains, propositions and rules must be generated from concatenations of simpler neuronal criterial satisfactions" (p. 24). This is the personification equivocation: trading on reason-giving (excellent fuel economy) for Sally's decision vs. a form of neuronal dynamics where neurons fire when particular thresholds are met.

A second set of equivocations involves "information" and "information processing." Tse never actually defines "information." In many respects, the term functions as a primitive in his approach. His first informational equivocation takes shape as follows: On the one hand, Tse refers to information input such as Sally's reading newspaper ads and car reviews, where information for conscious beings has syntax, semantics and pragmatics -- in short information is only that which is understood by a conscious being (e.g., von Weizsäcker 1974). This sense of information is applicable to persons. On the other hand, Tse demands that information has to be physically realized, and that it arises "in the context of some criterial decoding or read-out mechanism, such as a neuron, capable of occupying many possible physical states" (p. 297). This sense of information is applicable to neurons, computers and other devices. When Tse writes about the information that conscious beings use in deliberation and choice, he draws on the first sense of information, but when he explicates his account of mental causation and free will, he explicitly invokes the second form of information. So a version of the personification equivocation lurks here, too.

It should be pointed out that we don't actually know what it means for information in the first sense to be physically realized in the second sense. A poem, for instance, is not the ink and paper it's printed on, and the interpretation of the poem isn't a function of the ink and paper either. And the paper on which you write your name isn't information. Your written name only becomes information in the context of it being a signature on a check, or a bill, or an informed consent agreement, or some other such context. Neuroscientists, such as Tse, always speak metaphorically about information though they seem to not recognize this; consequently, it's very common for them to fall into the personification equivocation when talking about information.

Tse's second informational ambiguity: In some places, he says that neurons physically realize information and informational criteria. In other places, he says that it is as if neurons do this, i.e., we project this role onto neurons in our attempts to come to understand them. Here are some representative examples:

Neurons can be thought to physically realize informational criteria placed on characteristics of their input . . . All informational criteria are realized in physical processes (pp. 31, 32, emphasis added)

a neuron cannot be thought to assess information criterially when considered in isolation. It just takes chemicals, such as glucose, oxygen, neurotransmitters, and ions, as inputs. But if the threshold for firing is met if and only if certain kinds of informational facts are true about the inputs, then the mechanism underlying neuronal firing not only assesses net potential at the axonal hillock, it also assesses these informational facts. In this way, physical criteria placed on physical inputs can realize informational criteria placed on informational inputs. (p. 33, emphasis added, except for "if and only if")

Not only does Tse vacillate between treating neurons as processing information, assessing information, and so forth, on the one hand, and treating them as if they deal with information in these ways, the personification equivocation shows up again. Assessing whether facts are true, dealing with information, interpreting physical features as "criteria" or "information" are all quintessential human capacities that involve interpretation. Thinking of neurons as engaging in these same activities also is an interpretation that only gets its plausibility by projecting quintessential human capacities onto neurons; but then it becomes very easy to confuse the capacities of persons and neurons. The personification equivocation hides a multitude of sins.

The second reason to doubt Tse's account is the causal closure of physics, or the causal completeness of physics (CCP). If CCP is true, then no such thing as free will is possible because there is no sense in which there is any form of free action (Allison 1997; Bishop 2010; Bishop and Atmanspacher 2011). Tse recognizes that there are problems for mental causation and free will if CCP is true, because then Jaegwon Kim's (2007) causal exclusion argument would effectively rule out any mental causation. Tse is correct that CCP is a crucial premise in Kim's argument. Unfortunately, Tse thinks that if there is ontological indeterminism in the most elementary domain of physics, then the causal exclusion argument fails (pp. 249-254). Although Kim's exclusion argument may require nuance if ontological indeterminism is true ontological indeterminism, contrary to Tse's view, by itself doesn't invalidate CCP. CCP is a thesis about the causal structure of the world implying no mental causation is effective in any physical outcomes regardless of the deterministic status of the most elementary forces and particles (Bishop 2006). Ontological indeterminism may change how neurons behave relative to ontological determinism, but this change doesn't amount to the failure of CCP.

A third reason to doubt Tse's account of mental causation and free will is that it fails to escape CCP. His account depends upon the capacities of neurons to reset -- "choose" -- new criterialthresholds for future inputs to meet. However, CCP means that it's only the underlying physics that counts in such activity. Tse requires that information always be physically realized, so CCP would imply that physically-realized information ultimately is configurations of elementary particles and forces. Likewise, the activities of neurons also are ultimately the play of elementary particles and forces. Ultimately, there is no genuine mental causation or "free will" exercised by neurons. Any resetting of criterial targets is a function of the activity of elementary particles and forces whether this activity is deterministic or indeterministic. Indeed, any account of mental causation and free will presupposing that all higher-level phenomena, such as reasoning and deciding, supervene on or are realized by lower-level assemblies of neurons, is deeply problematic for action and free will (Allison 1997; Bishop 2010). As Henry Allison (1997) argues, if our account of agency must be completely mappable onto the underlying scientific causal vocabulary, then the concept of agency disappears as everything we call human action turns into merely flows of physical causes and effects, flows that simply channel through "us."

Tse seems to think that he has escaped the implications of CCP and reduction (pp. 34-36) because ontological indeterminism supposedly blocks any reduction. Consider his example:

Neurons carry, communicate, compute and transform information by transforming action potential spike inputs into spike trains sent to other neurons. If I say "Please pick up your coffee cup," and you do, then a pattern of air vibrations has been transduced into neural firings in nerves that receive input from inner hair cells; this is in turn transformed multiple times across neuronal subpopulations until the meaning has been decoded at the level of words and a proposition . . . . To try to cut information and meaning out of the causal picture here, as radical reductionists and epiphenomenalists do, by arguing that there are only particles interacting with particles, makes a fundamental error. Of course there are only particles interacting with particles. But assuming ontological indeterminism . . . countless sets of particle paths could physically follow my command given your initial physical state and the physical state of the world at the moment of the word "cup." (pp. 34-35)

Note the personification equivocation, again, playing on human capacities for communication, handling information, and meaning vs. neural mechanisms. More importantly, Tse's defense of meaning against reduction depends on ontological indeterminism providing "countless sets of particle paths [that] could physically follow my command given your initial physical state and the physical state of the world at the moment of the word 'cup.'" But whether ontological indeterminism is true or not, the mere possibility of countless sets of particle paths neither yields meaning, nor preserves any genuine possibilities for action, will, intention or any other capacities characteristic of human activity (Allison 1997; Bishop 2010).

Indeed, Tse doesn't seem to notice that he endorses a reductive view: "Of course there are only particles interacting with particles." Moreover, despite his protests, this view is eliminative: there is no sense in which "particle paths could physically" follow a command, or even find a command meaningful simply because indeterminism is true. Meanings do not exist for elementary particles and forces; rather, meanings, commands, and so forth are replaced by "countless sets of particle paths." To speak of electrons following a command or finding a command meaningful exhibits the personification equivocation. Furthermore, Tse gives us no reasons to think that indeterminism crucially allows meaningful human action in a world where particles and forces do all the work he attributes to neurons.

Doubtless one reason why Tse is blind to his failure to avoid CCP and a reductive/eliminative account of mental causation and free will is the pervasive nature of the personification equivocation. This equivocation allows Tse to seamlessly replace quintessential human capacities involved in free will (e.g., assessing criteria, determining truth, choosing among options) with neural mechanisms that are ascribed the same capacities in the same terms as conscious persons. Clean up the personification equivocation, however, and the reductive/eliminative nature of his account is readily apparent. Consider facial or any other object recognition: at "some point in the ventral information-processing stream, object representations must be compared with representations stored in memory. A decision must then be made concerning the best match" (pp. 42-43). Comparison is pattern matching, for Tse, but making decisions is what persons do, not subsystems of brains or even whole brains. The personification equivocation is at work, here, trading on decisions as persons make them vs. pattern matching to some threshold criteria. Pattern matching at the level of neurons is a mechanism, not a decision, but the equivocation allowing Tse to unwittingly personify neurons masks the replacement of important human capacities by neural mechanisms (and, in turn, the replacement of neural mechanisms by elementary particles and forces).

A "decision" for Tse in the context of object recognition is an "effector response" to a perception of the correct direction of motion, for the "frontal eye field neurons . . . make decisions based on a more abstract informational format, such as category, which must then be translated into a format executable by a particular effector, such as the arms or eyes" (p. 44). These are mechanistic processes and events of input detection and response, hardly the stuff we usually analyze as decisions that persons make based on meanings and deliberation. Tse does mention that willing could involve abstract, higher-level propositions such as "I should drink more water" (p. 44), but this, too, is the response of a high-level motor "plan" responding to a "desire" for water. Tse's account of mental causation and free will ultimately is a mechanistic one where equivocation on key notions such as willing, choosing, planning, valuing, information, assessment, and so forth, mask the replacements of what persons do when they engage in decisions by mechanized response to inputs. The richness of our human experience and practices of free will and action disappear.

Equivocating on key terms such as 'assessing', 'deciding' and 'willing' likely would go unnoticed if you are presupposing a strictly instrumental view of action, where all cause-effect chains are modeled on efficient causation, and the main idea is to discern the most efficient or effective means for achieving a pre-set goal. Everything is reduced to instruments for achieving goals. Instrumental action appears to fit seamlessly a world of efficient cause-effects chains that the sciences study. On the instrumental view Tse offers, human actions are the effects of efficient causal chains no different in kind from a thermostat triggering the A/C to come on when a preset threshold is met (except that somehow the thermostat has an unidentified power to change the threshold once the threshold has been met). Tse likely does not realize that his being enmeshed in an instrumental view of action leads him to personify neurons and thereby mechanize assessing, deciding and willing, among other activities, at all levels of his account. The instrumental view of action masks the mechanical nature of the cause-effect chains under a much richer vocabulary of human action. Moreover, Tse likely does not realize how deeply the instrumental view of action is shaped by Western cultural ideals (Bishop 2013).

In conclusion, Tse tells us that he is going to give us a neuroscientific account of free will and consciousness, but his metaphysics of realization, the personification equivocation and the commitment to an instrumental picture of action amounts to a philosophical account with philosophical assumptions (that there is such a thing as information causation, that propositions and judgments are realized in collections of neurons, that neurons deal with/recognize information, etc.). None of these are scientifically established facts; rather, they are the bread and butter stuff of philosophical arguments in the philosophy of mind.

Do we need neuroscience insight for aiding our understanding of free will and mental causation? Certainly (cf., Atmanspacher and Rotter, 2008; Harbecke and Atmanspacher, 2012). Does Tse's ceding everything to neuroscience while not escaping CCP and reduction give us the insight we need? No. It seems that neuroscience is too important to leave to the neuroscientists!


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Bishop, R. C. (2010), "Free Will and the Causal Closure of Physics," in R. Chiao, M. L. Cohen, A. J. Leggett, W. D. Phillips and C. L. Harper (eds.), Visions of Discovery: New Light on Physics, Cosmology and Consciousness. Cambridge University Press, pp. 601-611.

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Harbecke and Atmanspacher (2012), "Horizontal and Vertical Determination of Mental and Neural States," Journal of Theoretical and Philosophical Psychology 32: 161-179.

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Strawson, G. (2004), "Free Will," in E. Craig (ed.), Routledge Encyclopedia of Philosophy, Vol. 3. London: Routledge, pp. 743-753.

von Weizsäcker, C.F. (1974), Die Einheit der Natur. Munich: Deutscher Taschenbuch Verlag.

[1]Bennett and Hacker (2003) give copious examples of such equivocations in neuroscience.