Neuroethics and the Scientific Revision of Common Sense

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Nada Gligorov, Neuroethics and the Scientific Revision of Common Sense, Springer, 2016, 169pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9789402409642.

Reviewed by L. Syd M. Johnson, Michigan Technological University


Neuroethics is avowedly interdisciplinary, although scholarship in neuroethics remains sometimes stubbornly siloed, either more engaged in neuroscience, with only handwaving towards ethical concerns, or more obviously focused on ethics with a less rigorous grasp on current neuroscientific developments. Nada Gligorov focuses on several of the more metaphysical concerns in neuroethics and engages in an insightful way with philosophy of mind and empirical neuroscience. What's generally missing in this slender volume is ethics and attention to drawing out the ethical implications of the book's interesting conclusions. But as a work that seeks to bridge philosophy of mind and neuroethics, it is philosophically ambitious and rich in a welcome way. The writing is generally crisp and concise, and Gligorov's ability to explain complex ideas clearly will be of particular value to readers less familiar with the enormous literature in philosophy of mind.

The foundational theme of the book is that concepts Gligorov identifies as being within the sphere of common sense, or folk concepts, are amenable to and incorporate developments in neuroscience and science. The concepts under consideration are free will, cognitive enhancement and personal identity, memory, neural privacy, pain, and brain death. Gligorov's primary thesis is that folk or common sense concepts are not fixed and static, but evolve through constant revision to incorporate scientific evidence, including neuroscientific evidence. That's an eminently sensible position -- we see few folk seriously entertaining flat earth and phlogiston theories nowadays -- and Gligorov is able to make this argument with little difficulty. Her primary interlocutors in this task are eliminative materialists, and especially Churchland's claim that folk psychology is static and has not progressed since the time of the ancient Greeks. Gligorov maintains that common sense folk psychology is an empirically evaluable theory, which, again, is reasonable. The counterclaim would be that it is not, because it posits nonempirical entities. Against this, Gligorov argues that an intertheoretic reduction of common sense psychology and its entities to neuroscience would vindicate, but not eliminate common sense entities by demonstrating their instantiation in the brain. If mental states are localized in the brain, and are physical states of the brain, our common sense concepts of mental states would have to change, but those concepts are not incompatible with neuroscience, and are thus empirically evaluable as to their veridicality.

An eliminativist could claim that the revision and reduction of folk concepts about entities like beliefs, desires, and mental states have failed because they are fundamentally incompatible with neuroscientific facts, and should be eliminated rather than reduced. The phlogiston theory was not merely reduced in the process of explaining oxidation. Phlogiston was instead eliminated from common sense and science because it does not exist. Indeed, an eliminativist would argue that revisions of common sense concepts, even if those revisions make common sense more amenable to scientific conceptual frameworks, will be false so long as those scientific frameworks remain infected by common sense concepts like mental causation that do not exist. In other words, an eliminativist need not disagree that common sense is mutable and amenable to neuroscientific revision to find common-sense (or scientific) explanations still wanting.

Once Gligorov has made her case that common sense or folk concepts are not only revisable but also have already been revised by scientific concepts, she proceeds to demonstrate that concerning some common sense concepts, such as free will, we are mistaken about the content of those concepts. The upshot is that neuroscientific evidence, such as Libet's experiment, that purports to show there is no free will fails to do so with respect to free will as it is actually conceptualized by the folk. In making this point, she is able to point to a rich body of recent X-Phi studies concerning attitudes about free will. It is less clear how her framing thesis about the amenability of common sense to neuroscientific evidence applies to the concerns addressed in the chapters on cognitive enhancement and personal identity, memory and identity, mental privacy, and the subjectivity of pain. It is less clear because precisely what the folk and common sense have to say about these issues is not especially clear. It's not obvious that there is an articulable common-sense theory about enhancement, for instance, and one implication to be drawn from Gligorov's thesis is that common sense is frequently in flux and inherently unstable. One need only look to attitudes about athletic enhancement to note obvious tensions in folk attitudes and beliefs about enhancement and its effects on identity and authenticity.

Space does not permit me to go on at length about all of these chapters, so in what follows I'll focus on the brain death chapter (which is based on a 2016 paper), where there is an articulable common sense understanding of traditional death, but where it is also the case that scientific innovation has arguably had the effect of muddling rather than clarifying that understanding.

The debate about brain death involves two questions. One concerns the nature or definition of death, and the other concerns how death can be identified, particularly in the liminal period, prior to the emergence of obvious signs like rigor mortis and decomposition. Few events in human life have the social, cultural, religious, and legal gravity of death, so the former question -- what is death? -- matters a great deal. The latter question -- how do we identify death? -- is important because the first matters. Death marks the end of legal, social, and moral personhood, when a human organism no longer has the rights of a person, and when certain special rites must be performed, such as funerals, burials, and the reading of wills. In places with advanced medical technology, the removal of physiological supports like ventilators is another such rite.

Gligorov defends whole brain death, and challenges the distinction between the traditional, common-sense notion of death -- identified as cardiac death -- and the so-called technical, scientific notion of brain death. The traditional notion of death, she argues, has already incorporated technical, scientific innovation (the stethoscope), which permitted cardiac death to supplant putrefaction as a sign of death. Similarly, the invention of the ventilator necessitated the identification of brain death as an additional physical state to mark the moment of death. Indeed, she argues that there are no "nontechnical concepts of death," since all concepts of death are supported by different theories about the nature, or definition of death. (This claim is dubious, as I rather suspect there are nontechnical definitions of death in some traditional folk understandings of it, e.g. that death is the separation of the immaterial soul and the physical body.)

Gligorov is interested in how we identify the moment of death, which requires identifying an adequate biological background theory about the functioning of a human organism. The adequacy of that theory will guarantee that the moment of death can be correctly identified. Hence, Gligorov turns to the identification of the correct biological theory. She aims to do this by expanding on previous attempts to describe the integration of the human organism in a way that avoids the pitfalls of mind-body or body-brain dualism. Gligorov identifies these dualisms as motivating the distinction, held by both critics and proponents of brain death, between the death of the brain and the death of the body. Proponents of whole brain death, like James Bernat and the President's Commission, have argued that the brain is necessary for the "integrative unity of the organism as a whole" (1981). The Commission claimed that brain death is physiologically identical to "ordinary death" and that brain-dead organisms quickly and inevitably deteriorate into cardiopulmonary collapse (1981). For Bernat, the brain's critical functions are consciousness and the maintenance of bodily processes needed for cellular metabolism and homeostasis (Bernat 1998). Critics of whole brain death, notably D. Alan Shewmon, have argued that somatic unity and integration are not mediated by the brain. In support of this, Shewmon amassed a large number of cases of chronic brain death in which there was prolonged somatic survival, integration, and health without a functioning brain (Shewmon 1998). These views all posit the brain or mind as an entity separate from, but interacting with, the body.

Gligorov does not successfully respond to Shewmon's argument that somatic integration is indicative of continued life. Shewmon advances this argument precisely to counter the fallacious claim that brain death is equivalent to ordinary (or traditional) death because it results in the inevitable loss of somatic integration. His examples of continued somatic integration and health following brain death are evidence against that. Gligorov claims that Shewmon's argument is that if brain death is not followed quickly by cardiac arrest it is not death. This is like arguing, she writes, that "the cessation of cardiac function is not death unless putrefaction occurs within a certain amount of time" (149). While Shewmon does claim that the permanent loss of circulatory-respiratory function results in death (which ought to be undeniable), he does not claim that brain death is death if and only if it is immediately followed by cardiac arrest. His argument is that it is not death at all, and that the claim in support of it being death -- the loss of integrated somatic function -- is empirically false. Moreover, those brain-mediated functions that are somatically integrating are not always absent in brain death as diagnosed by current standards -- that is, whole brain death is itself a misnomer (Shewmon 2001).

Other critics of whole brain death, like Robert Veatch, have given up on defining death biologically, and endorse a "higher brain" view of death in which it is the loss of moral personhood (which follows from the permanent loss of consciousness) that entails death (Veatch 2005). Veatch's view is a form of mind-body dualism, according to Gligorov, although in contrast to Cartesian dualism, it doesn't posit an immaterial or immortal soul, but rather an embodied consciousness which is lost when consciousness-supporting functions of the brain are destroyed.

As a physicalist, Gligorov is committed to the view that psychological functions are produced by the brain, and are relevant to the integrated functioning of the organism in a way that allows the possibility of having a strictly biological, non-dualist conception of death. She proposes a "broader construal of psychological states" (155) in which having mental or psychological states does not require consciousness, thus addressing mind-body dualism. She cites as evidence for unconscious perceptions the existence of first-order mental states in the absence of second-order states about those states. She also cites the McGurk effect as an example of the unconscious uncoupling of multisensory information, as well as research showing that unconscious perceptions can inhibit automatic responses (156). These provide evidence, Gligorov argues, for subliminal psychological processes that do not require consciousness, and show that consciousness is not needed for perception, attention, or behavior. Consciousness, then, should not be privileged in the brain death debate, and psychological states, broadly construed, must be incorporated in the concept of the "integrated functioning of the organism."

One of the drivers of Gligorov's argument is Bernat's claim that consciousness is required for an organism to "respond to requirements for nutrition and hydration" (157). Much depends, of course, on what is meant by "respond," and Gligorov's objective is to show that consciousness is not required, because presumably such responses can operate unconsciously. This leads her to endorse consciousness plus an expanded conception of psychological function as necessary to her account of integrated functioning. Her conception includes three elements, none of which are privileged: (1) somatic or bodily integration; (2) psychophysical integration, by which she means the integration needed for processing of external stimuli and behavioral outputs, and the psychological abilities required for nutrition and hydration; and (3) psychological integration of the functions required for memory, learning, attention, consciousness, and other higher functions. On Gligorov's view, the loss of all three marks the moment of death, and the loss of the entire brain results in the loss of all three. Thus, she argues for whole brain death, but in a way that avoids falling into dualism, and promoting either consciousness or somatic integration. That promotion is presumably what leads to the intractability of the brain death debate, since either side can simply point to the privileged status of either brain/mind or body in determining death.

Gligorov's maneuver here is to show that mind/brain-body dualist accounts of death are false because (a) the brain is part of the body, so the whole organism fails to be somatically integrated in brain death; and because (b) unconscious psychological processes have a role in the functioning of the organism as a whole, so the loss of embodied consciousness is not by itself death. Psychophysical integration bridges mind and body, and its loss (and the subsequent loss of the sensory and motor integration required for voluntary behavior), together with the loss of consciousness and somatic integration, is death. Whole brain death, then, marks the moment of death in accordance with a biologically adequate theory of the functioning of an organism.

A practical implication of Gligorov's more complete account of whole brain death would be the requirement that it be truly and completely the loss of the entire brain and all of its functions, which is more than the current diagnosis of brain death requires. Some discussion of this implication would have been welcome, since it gets to the heart of why the brain death debate is so ethically fraught. Common sense would, I take it, require that something called "brain death" involve the death of the entire brain. Gligorov notes that a biological concept of death need not capture "purportedly commonsense notions about death," (160) although her concept does seem to capture the intuition that if nothing about an organism is functioning, that organism is dead. Circling back to her framing thesis, common sense might be able to assimilate this account of death, but given the confounding social, cultural, and religious meanings of death, it could not be done easily, because death is more than a scientific or biological phenomenon. In other words, clarifying the scientific concept of death will make little headway towards resolving the brain death dispute.


Bernat, J.L. (1998). A defense of the whole-brain concept of death. The Hastings Center Report, 28(2): 14-23.

Gligorov, N. (2016). A defense of brain death. Neuroethics, 9(2), 119-127.

President's Commission for the Study of Ethical Problems in Medicine and Biomedical and Behavioral Research (1981). Defining death: Medical, legal and ethical issues in the determination of death. U.S. Government Printing Office.

Shewmon, D. A. (1998). Chronic "brain death": Meta-analysis and conceptual consequences. Neurology, 51(6), 1538-1545.

Shewmon, D. A. (2001). The brain and somatic integration: insights into the standard biological rationale for equating "brain death" with death. Journal of Medicine and Philosophy, 26(5), 457-478.

Veatch, R. M. (2005). The death of whole-brain death: the plague of the disaggregators, somaticists, and mentalists. Journal of Medicine and Philosophy, 30(4), 353-378.