Neuroexistentialism: Meaning, Morals, and Purpose in the Age of Neuroscience

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Gregg D. Caruso and Owen Flanagan (eds.), Neuroexistentialism: Meaning, Morals, and Purpose in the Age of Neuroscience, Oxford University Press, 2018, 368pp., $34.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780190460730.

Reviewed by Markus Gabriel, University of Bonn


The present volume is very ambitious in its thematic scope and covers four dimensions of the implications of neuroscience, or rather, of philosophical interpretations of the role that neuroscience might play for our self-understanding as agents and thinkers. It is based on a sweeping historical claim according to which we live in "the age of neuroscience", which is supposed to lead to a crisis in the human self-conception worthy of a third wave of existentialism.

As a matter of fact, the papers collected  are clearly not all written in order to substantiate the claims of the editors and so make a rather disparate impression. For this reason, I will focus only on some of the papers that are closer to the official aim of the volume, so as to avoid a merely piecemeal discussion.

The editors, Gregg D. Caruso and Owen Flanagan, open with a preface in which they lay out their overall take on existentialism. For them, existentialism "is a philosophical expression of the anxiety that there are no deep, satisfying answers" to the questions driving "the quest of perennial philosophy to locate firm foundations for meaning and morals" (p. ix). Existentialism therefore asserts "that there are no secure foundations for meaning and morality, no deep reasons that make sense of the human predicament." (p. ix)

Caruso and Flanagan believe that there are "three kinds of existentialism". These correspond to "three different kinds of grounding projects -- grounding in God's nature, in a shared vision of the collective good, or in science." (p. ix) They associate the first two waves with big figures. Number one is supposed to be represented by Kierkegaard, Dostoevsky, and Nietzsche; number two by Sartre, Camus and de Beauvoir.[1] Number three, neuroexistentialism, is an invention of the editors and the supposed object of investigation of the papers in the volume.

Unfortunately, their invention not only comes too late, as all the problems they articulate were already central for the earlier two waves; it also rests on a problematic disanalogy between the different kinds of existentialism they invoke. The point I have in mind is the following: while the earlier forms of existentialism deny that God, theology or an overall human community constituted by a universal value system laid down in pure reason itself can be the ground of human meaning and morality, their third wave of existentialism actually relies on the alleged discovery of a ground of human agency and thinking. Whilst earlier forms of existentialism indeed renounce the notion that there is a substantial human essence, reference to which puts us in a position to confer deep meanings on our lives, the third form is based on just such an idea. For Caruso and Flanagan, "science yields the truth about human nature" (p. ix). However, the very point of existentialism is usually taken to be the opposite of that view.

So third-wave existentialism, which Caruso and Flanagan further articulate in chapter one, seems to me to be more or less the opposite of the two other forms of existentialism. Indeed, I have serious doubts that the phenomenon under investigation even exists. Caruso and Flanagan maintain that neuroexistentialism

is what you get when Geisteswissenschaften [sic! this is a plural in German] reaches the stage where it finally and self-consciously exorcizes the geist and recommends that no one should take seriously the Cartesian myth of the ghost in the machine (p. 2)

At the same time, neuroexistentialism is "defined here as a zeitgeist" (p. 2). Apparently, the Geist/ghost is not quite exorcized, but haunts the editors in the form of their own erroneous conception of the historical moment they think they are living in (the "age of neuroscience"). At this point, it might be important to remind some of the Anglophone readers of this review that the German word "Geist" in "Geisteswissenschaften" has absolutely nothing to do with "ghost," let alone with the "ghost in the machine." A little knowledge of the history of the disciplines called "Geisteswissenschaften" in Germany might have been helpful. What Dilthey talks about and what Hegel discusses under the heading of "Geist" is nothing like the presence of ectoplasm in a human body, but rather the simple idea that humans coordinate their social life in terms of objectifications of their self-understanding of the human (including religious systems, art, a legal system, philosophy, science etc.). The fundamental idea behind the term "Geist" is that the human life form is such that our value systems derive from claims about human nature, regardless of their actual truth or falsity.[2]

Caruso and Flanagan make lots of big claims as if they expressed generally accepted and scientifically grounded facts, such as "the mind is the brain" (p. 4) or that

for most ordinary folk and many members of the nonscientific academy, the idea that humans are animals and that the mind is the brain is destabilizing and disenchanting, quite possibly nauseating, a source of dread, fear, and trembling, sickness unto death even. (pp. 4f.)

To my mind, this sentence at best resembles an involuntary caricature of existentialism. On what grounds do they make such claims? Did they carry out surveys (and how on earth can they warrant their bold assertion that the "existentialists were sociologically naïve" (p. 15))? Do they realize that pretty much no one in the history of philosophy ever doubted that humans are animals? Are they aware that Hegel, for example, in his philosophy of nature in the Encyclopedia argues that there can be no "Geist" (no mindedness) without neural circuits, which was, of course, a known fact for centuries before the introduction of the very idea of the humanities or "Geisteswissenschaften," as they are called in my neck of the woods? Neuroexistentialism is supposed to be a consequence of such insights as "the universe is causally closed, and the mind is the brain." (p. 8) However, how do Caruso and Flanagan know these extraordinary facts given that science is nowhere near having settled such large metaphysical issues? Neuroscience, as I know it from my own collaborations with neuroscientists, has not discovered that the mind is the brain. For one thing, it is not. At most, mental processes are associated with certain subsystems of the brain. Be that as it may, Caruso and Flanagan write as if the hard problem of consciousness were solved or as if we knew what the minimal neural correlate of consciousness was (we do not). They seem to be aware of the fact that their scientific claims are, to put it mildly, exaggerations of the current state of scientific knowledge, as is evidenced by their more cautious (but still erroneous, or at least completely unsubstantiated) claim that "mind-science advances under the guidance of the regulative idea that the mind is the brain" (p. 9). To sum up: neither the preface nor the first chapter offer any substantial reason to believe that there is such a thing as third-wave existentialism, neuroexistentialism, or that the representatives of this non-existent movement have the historical and philosophical knowledge of the earlier forms of existentialism that would be required to pass any judgment on these projects. Worse still, in their own classification, the third wave is precisely a project of grounding meaning and morality in human nature (as described by neuroscience in tandem with other natural sciences), meaning that their neuroexistentialism in any event has nothing to do with existentialism, but is at best a new name for a brand of good old bald metaphysical naturalism.

Part I is dedicated to "Morality, Love, and Emotion". It contains a good paper by Jesse Prinz which actually develops a neuroscientifically informed contribution to existentialist theorizing. Together with the interesting papers by Neil Levy and by Shaun Gallagher, Ben Morgan, and Naomi Rokotnitzit seems to me to be the core of the kind of arguments one might identify with a form of "neuroexistentialism," albeit not quite the one Caruso and Flanagan seem to have in mind. Prinz begins with a clear definition of the phenomenon of sedimentation as that "of experiencing the world and acting in it through the filter of the past, without necessarily realizing it." (p. 89) He suggests that Camus and Sartre in particular "underestimate the power of sedimentation" (p. 91) in their accounts of free human agency. For Prinz, moral sedimentation consists in "the past patterns of proscription that shape present attitudes and guide current behavior." (p. 89) To be sure, this is not new. It corresponds to Freud's postulate of memory traces (represented by neural circuits for early Freud) and was already defended by Nietzsche, who would subscribe to Prinz' statement that "the acquisition of value is a matter of training the body to respond. To moralize is to act physically." (p. 97) Other important and much more developed precursors happen to be Descartes' and Spinoza's theories of human passions, just to mention some random landmarks in the history of this topic. At most, what is new is that Prinz refers to "brain imaging" and "moral neuroscience" (p. 96), which has to some extent empirically confirmed the position that morality "seems to have an emotional basis." (p. 96) Prinz is aware of Merleau-Ponty's interdisciplinary work with neurologists and that Fanon trained as a medical doctor and took up a position in a psychiatric clinic. However, he neglects the equally well-known fact that Sartre was very well versed in psychology and also cooperated with psychiatrists. It is, thus, highly problematic to assume that Sartre's theory of freedom can easily be dealt with by claiming that he was not aware of moral sedimentation. As a matter of fact, the opposite was true, an acknowledgement of which would require a detailed reconstruction of Sartre and his defense of radical existential freedom.

Neil Levy looks at the issue of choices without choosers on account of the fact that cognitive science in his view speaks against the existence of a "unified self" (p. 111). He makes the same mistake as Caruso and Flanagan and other authors in this volume, namely of disregarding the actual historical facts about existentialism, when he maintains that, of all people, the "existentialists were sociologically naïve in supposing a degree of distinction between agents and their cultural milieu that was never realistic." (p. 111) This suggests he cannot be aware of Sartre's books such as Saint Genet, The Family Idiot or his novels and plays, not to mention the Critique of Dialectical Reason. Another important fact about Sartre's most famous account of human agency, given in in Being and Nothingness, is that the self is precisely nothing, no entity in the world of any kind. Hence, Sartre would completely agree that there "Is no central executive," even though he would evidently object to the notion that "the mind consists of nothing but such unintelligent mechanisms." (p. 115) Levy is guilty of objectifying the self, which leads to the unsolvable conceptual problems that appear in the form of obvious contradictions right at the outset of his paper. Here, he maintains that contemporary "cognitive science shakes our faith in the existence of" an "agent, who could be the locus of the choice we each confront." (p. 111)

there is no one to choose values; rather, each of us is a motley of different mechanisms and processes, each of which lack the intelligence to confront big existential questions and each pulling in a different direction. (p. 111)

If this were true, then how on earth can we "each impose a degree of unity on ourselves" (p. 111)? Who is this "we" who imposes something on someone if by hypothesis there is no intelligent agent? And if there is no self, how should it "be seen as an achievement and not a given" (p. 121)? Levy wants to achieve the impossible, which is generally not recommended. Instead, he could have tried to reconstruct the battery of arguments presented by Sartre against the kind of view he himself propounds. After all, such views were well known at the time of Sartre's writing, which did not occur in a scientific vacuum.

A much more informed and conceptually articulated account of a possible encounter between neuroscience and actual existentialism can be found in Gallagher, Morgan, and Rokotnitz's chapter. Contrary to many of the contributors, they endorse a broader account of the relationship between mind and body. They assume that the "4Es" ("the embodied, embedded, enactive, and extended conception of mind" (p. 126)) are a better starting point for understanding the role an actual existentialism could play with respect to neuroscience. This is certainly right given that 20th century existentialism is heavily indebted to phenomenology, which was the historical breeding ground of the 4Es. Yet, this involves a denial of the neurocentric view adopted by the editors and an acceptance of the idea that the brain is essentially "taken as part of the brain-body-environment system" (p. 126). On this basis, they approach Heidegger's difficult notion of "authenticity (Eigentlichkeit)", proposed in Being and Time. They challenge the oversimplifications created by one-sided interpretations of neuroscience that allegedly support denials of the self or of freedom on account of the Libet (and similar) experiments, and they equally avoid fully accepting the opposite extreme view "that neuroscience is itself a form of human inauthenticity" (p. 135), which would not live up to the standards of Heidegger's philosophy of science in Being and Time, according to which the sciences are a legitimate mode of disclosure of reality (albeit one among many). However, they come to the conclusion that existentialism is much more likely to take the shape of a broader conception of the human brain than the one endorsed by the editors. In short, existentialism and neurocentrism are in tension precisely because some of the major terms of existentialism deal with the human being and "the human being is not just a brain, but is rather an extended system-in-the-world, in ways that are enactively relational." (p. 138)

It is noteworthy that the natural-scientific contributions, in particular Michael S. Gazzaniga's and Sean M. Carroll's, strike a somewhat different note in being much more metaphysically modest than those papers that base their conceptual assumptions on alleged neuroscientific findings or discoveries in "contemporary cognitive science," sometimes without providing a single reference to an actual recent study, let alone a detailed justification of their preferred interpretation of scientific findings! Gazzaniga entertains the possibility that there is "downward causation" and that therefore "Mental states interact with neuronal states to produce conscious states." (231) He even considers a downward-causal influence from "a social layer" (pp. 232f.) to personal responsibility, because the latter "is not to be found in the brain, any more than traffic can be understood by knowing about everything inside a car." (p. 233) His paper is a prime example of a non-reductionist, metaphysically modest and explorative attitude towards neuroscience and its actual implications for human self-understanding. And it provides a clear piece of evidence for the fact that there is a difference between the informed views of working neuroscientists and the overgeneralized metaphysical interpretations endorsed by some of the contributors to the present volume who subscribe to the "neuroexistentialism" outlined in the chapter 1.

Carroll covers some of the ground concerning the relationship between physics and freedom and makes some well-known suggestions concerning causation as related to the arrow of time, which he takes to be grounded in the second law of thermodynamics. This is a widespread, albeit sometimes contested view. Carroll is aware of Jennan Ismael's outstanding book by on the relevant topics and does not really add anything here apart from some paragraphs about existentialism which show that he is not a professional philosopher.[3] Mind you, this is of course not to reproach his laudable attempt to articulate to a philosophical audience what he knows as a first-rate theoretical physicist, and to contribute to a much needed transdisciplinary dialogue between physics and metaphysics in which both sides respect the expertise of the other.

To be sure, contemporary neuroscience, physics, and philosophy can learn a lot from mutual engagement, which can certainly lead to deep new insights. Yet, this means dropping many of the common assumptions popular among a subsystem of professors in philosophy departments, such as that neuroscience has disproved free will (it has not, which does not entail that there is such a thing!) or that physics entails some kind of materialism, not to mention the silly identification of the brain and the mind, which is not grounded in anything we actually know from neuroscientific research (even presupposing we have already solved the problem of individuating "the brain" as an overall biological system in a human organism).

This leads me to my conclusion concerning the present volume. It could have profited from an in-depth investigation into the conceptual and philosophical architecture of existentialism and existential thought as they have developed over the last two hundred years. This would have led to the insight that neither neuroscience nor the interaction of empirically grounded psychology and physics with the existentialist tradition are anything very recent. This is not just a matter of historical negligence on the part of the volume; it leads to a very shallow understanding of both existentialism and neuroscience among the majority of the contributors.[4] Many of the older contributions of existentialists to the mind-body/mind-brain-problem, or to articulating the role of modern science for our self-understanding as human beings, are so much more sophisticated that the current volume as a whole does not live up to the standards of first and second-wave of existentialism. More significantly, though, I think we ought to deny that there is even such a thing as "neuroexistentialism". Yet, whatever the validity of this negative existential assertion, it seems clear enough that neuroexistentialism is in pretty bad existential shape.[5]

[1] This categorization is clearly as incomplete as it is historically inadequate. Major figures such as Karl Jaspers and Martin Heidegger are missing, as is any reference to the historical fact that neuroscience is not an invention of recent decades. The worries of the alleged third wave are all at the center of philosophical discussions throughout the nineteenth century and culminate in debates surrounding the cogency of psychologism, the role of psychophysics for an account of the human mind, the relationship between modern physics and perception (just think of Bergson and Russell), etc.

[2] For more details see Markus Gabriel, I am not a Brain: Philosophy of Mind for the 21st Century, Polity, 2017; and Neo-Existentialism: How to Conceive of the Human Mind after Naturalism's Failure, edited by Jocelyn Maclure, with contributions by Jocelyn Benoist, Andrea Kern, and Charles Taylor, Polity, 2018. In these books I take the opposite view to Caruso and Flanagan, and diagnose positions such as theirs precisely as a form of existential self-delusion. I do not know if this makes Neo-Existentialism the fourth wave of existentialism. In any event, I do not believe that we live "in the age of neuroscience", but at best in an age where we have learned quite a bit about human psychology and physiology on the basis of actual neuroscientific findings. To say that we live in the age of neuroscience is like saying that we live in the digital age, the age of overpopulation, the age of American obesity, of the crisis of the European Union or what have you.

[3] See, for instance, the platitudinous claim on p. 306: "The universe, vast and impersonal, does not provide us with meaning, out there to be discovered; but by striving for authenticity in our actions we can create meaning for ourselves."

[4] The list of historical mistakes and caricatures in the present volume is too long to be discussed in detail. Let me just mention: 1) The idea that before Darwin and Freud there was such a thing as the "humanistic image" which denied that humans are animals, maintained that we have a soul and an afterlife, claimed that meaning is transcendental (what does this even mean?), etc. (p. 6) Are the authors of these words aware of the fact that not all humans were fundamentalist Christians before Darwin and Freud? Do they know that the "humanistic image" is a figment of their imagination? 2) Similar problems come to the fore in Patricia Churchland's musings about "religion" (p. 27) and the history of language. Her "argument" against a religious origin of morality involves the claim that "Hebrew" is a form of writing and a restriction of religion to the two cases of hunter-gatherer "'folk' religions" (p. 27) on the one hand and "Christianity or Judaism" on the other hand. No actual piece of evidence is offered for the view that religion can only be the origin of morality if it has a "place for God-the-Law-Giver-and-Punisher." (p. 27) Religion and biblical monotheism happen not to be identical. The same applies to religiously grounded morality and the Ten Commandments.

[5] Another weakness of the book is editorial. There are frequent mistakes which could easily have been repaired, such as the repeated claim that homo sapiens has been around "for some 250,00 years" (p. 27, 29) or the one mentioned at the outset that the German word "Geist" means "ghost" in conjunction with "-wissenschaften".