Neuroscience and Philosophy

Neuroscience And Philosophy

Felipe De Brigard and Walter Sinnott-Armstrong (eds.), Neuroscience and Philosophy, MIT Press, 2022, 494pp., $65.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780262045438.

Reviewed by Valerie Gray Hardcastle, Northern Kentucky University


Stemming from a summer seminar series on common projects (or ideas for projects) across philosophy and neuroscience, this book features 14 essays written by small teams of researchers/ scholars from both philosophy and neuroscience on the topics that bedevil both disciplines: consciousness, memory, agency, the self, mental illness, and the like.

In the introduction to this volume, the editors (Felipe de Brigard and Walter Sinnott-Armstrong) stake out the intellectual territory of the book. They claim that neuroscience is far from being able to articulate how the brain works in any detail and “even farther from understanding how brain functions relate to operations of the human mind” (2). Let us set aside the issue of whether these statements are in fact true, and instead focus on the proffered solution: we need a theoretical framework for understanding mind-brain relations. The editors then claim this territory for philosophy. While I recognize that many philosophers of mind believe this is indeed their bailiwick, believing it does not make it so. Indeed, I think that the chapters in this book amply illustrate why philosophers should probably not have a significant stake in this territory—they have done a poor job at theorizing about the mind-brain, largely because they do not know enough about the mind or brain to have many useful insights.

I also want to note, especially for those who are not steeped in the relevant literatures, that the editors also claim that “at this juncture, philosophy and neuroscience are poised to work together, learn together, and advance together” (3), with this implication that this book is an (early?) example of just that. But this sort of collaboration has been happening on a regular basis since at least the early 1980s. Patricia Churchland’s Neurophilosophy (MIT Press, 1986) is one of the most prominent examples. I mention Churchland’s book in particular because she was one of the first philosophers whose basic argument for the duration of her long and fruitful career was that neuroscience has much to teach philosophers—so much so, in fact, that current data pretty much illustrate how conceptually misguided most philosophy of mind and moral philosophy is: they are misguided to the point of being outright useless.

In this book, instead of neuroscientists and philosophers working together to flesh out a workable theoretical mind-brain framework, what is really happening is that in chapter after chapter, the authors illustrate how the fundamental assumptions of many philosophers are just flat-out wrong. I do not see this volume as a happy collaboration between neuroscientists and philosophers, but it is instead (by and large) a schooling for traditional philosophers on scientific data relevant for the topics they have previously deemed purely theoretical. It is a good and interesting schooling, but it is a schooling none-the-less, and it is one that philosophers of morality and mind should (continue to) take seriously.

Indeed, as a practical matter, this volume really is not a coming together of two disparate fields to find common ground, for virtually all the contributors already either currently work in interdisciplinary centers comprised of some combination of philosophy, neuroscience, and psychology or have strong interdisciplinary backgrounds, and the majority come to this project with primary training in philosophy and secondary training in a mind or brain science. Like Churchland’s book, this book is written primarily by empirically minded philosophers for those not so empirically minded.

With this alternative framing of the volume front and center, let me provide a bit of a whirlwind tour of the lessons learned for philosophy and their larger implications. In “The Neuroscience of Moral Judgment: Empirical and Philosophical Developments,” Joshua May, Clifford Workman, Julia Hass, and Hyemin Han illustrate how an intellectual collaboration between neuroscience, psychology, and allied sciences strongly suggests that traditional philosophical frameworks for understanding (moral) reasoning as something separate from emotion is incomplete at best and misleadingly wrong at worst. Brain areas tied to emotions are also the same brain areas needed for making complex interferences. The fact that these areas appear to function automatically and outside conscious awareness takes their description even further afield from what philosophers typically assume about higher order judgments, both moral and otherwise.

Shannon Spauling, Rita Svetlova, and Hannah Read suggest in “The Nature of Empathy” that empathy is not just one thing, but a complex multifactorial emotional, motivational, and cognitive set of responses. Hence, philosophers who attempt to distill empathy into feeling what one believes another is feeling, or being motivated to respond based on shared feelings, or mentally simulating another’s psychological state are oversimplifying something much more complicated. Like the five blind persons examining different parts of an elephant to ascertain what it is, each of these approaches has some things right and some things wrong according to the empirical data, but each is also missing important components of the entirety of the concept.

Robyn Repko Waller and Allison Brager in “I Did That! Biomarkers of Volitional and Free Agency” argue that initiating an action and then believing oneself to be the author of that action are two requirements for personal agency, and thereby for being on the receiving end of moral judgments of that action. Philosophers generally agree that such practical decision-making can be disrupted by a variety of psychological factors, such as psychosis and extreme emotionality. The authors want to add more to this list, things like sleep deprivation. Their point is that not only do intense psychological states disrupt responsibility, but also that more mundane states could as well. Knowing something about the neurobiology of agency means that when to blame someone for their behavior suddenly becomes a much more complex question to answer.

In “Me, My (Moral) Self, and I,” Jim Everett, Joshua August Skorburg, and Jordan Livingston provide curated self-report evidence that a morality-based perspective on personal identity is more robust than a psychological view of personal identity.  That is, continuity in moral principles is more important in humans perceiving other humans as the same person over time than continuity in memories, which suggests that perhaps personal identity is not a metaphysical issue at all, but rather a folk psychological one.

“Neuroscience and Mental Illness,” by Natalia Washington, Cristina Leone, and Laura Niemi, provides several examples of how improvements in understanding the neural behavior underlying several mental disorders has fundamentally changed how psychiatrists and others understand the nature of the disorders themselves. For example, the changes in brain circuitry underlying addiction makes it clear that addiction is not a moral failing but rather reflects the alteration of our reward circuitry over which individuals have little to no control.

Both Eyal Aharoni, Sara Abdulla, Corey Allen, and Thomas Nadelhoffer in “Ethical Implications of Informed Risk Assessment,” and Gidon Felson and Jenny Blumenthal-Barby in “Ethical Issues Raised by Recent Developments in Neuroscience: The Case of Optogenetics,” use recent developments in neuroscientific tools to argue that traditional ethics or bioethics approaches to evaluating the potential use of these technologies in risk assessment for offenders or optogenetics in treating human disease are too ham-fisted to be much help. More subtlety and finer distinctions are needed to evaluate the potential uses properly and appropriately.

In “Touch and Other Somatosensory Senses,” Tony Cheng and Antonio Cataido want to expand the range of the philosophy of perception beyond the traditional choices of vision and sometimes audition to include tactile perception. Doing so would shift how we describe using perception to understand the structure of the external world, as well as the mind-body relationship. It also raises problems for how philosophers individuate the senses.

“What Do Models of Visual Perception Tell Us?,” by Rachel Denison, Ned Block, and Jason Samaha, points out that philosophy has not really addressed whether we can consciously experience perceptual uncertainty. This appears to be a completely open direction in philosophy of mind, and it is one that the various models of perception (which focus on perceptual decision-making and not on phenomenological visual experiences) provide different and contrasting answers.

In my reading of Anna Leshinskaya and Enoch Lambert’s “Implications from the Philosophy of Concepts for the Neuroscience of Memory Systems,” the chapter does not actually articulate how philosophy could help neuroscience (despite the title). Rather, it points out that philosophical approaches to understanding concepts or conceptual memory turn on a distinction that neither neuroscience nor psychology has adopted—the notion of the “sharedness” of a concept, a measure of how common a concept is across people. However, some philosophers believe that sharedness is fundamental to concepts; others believe it is irrelevant. Leshinskaya and Lambert propose ways to empirically test the concept’s actual value in human memory.

Finally, in contrast to the other chapters, neither “The Neural Substrates of Conscious Perception without Performance Confounds” by Jorge Morales, Brian Odegaard, and Brian Marniscalco nor “Memory Structure and Cognitive Maps” by Sarah Robins, Sara Aronowitz, and Arjen Stolk, nor “The Scientific Study of Passive Thinking: Methods of Mind-Wandering Research” by Samuel Murray, Zac Irving, and Kristina Krasich take philosophical arguments on directly. Instead, they each focus on exploring the recent scientific approaches to their assigned topics. “The Neural Substrates of Conscious Perceptions” discusses how to improve experimental techniques for detecting conscious vs. unconscious brain states, arguing that performance confounds are both real and ubiquitous, but that they can be managed experimentally. Doing so should yield better data regarding brain activity that reflects a conscious perceptual experience, which should assist in understanding either what consciousness is or what it is correlated with, depending on one’s underlying metaphysical commitments. “Memory Structure and Cognitive Maps” rehearses different theoretical approaches to understanding the structure of information housed in our memory, highlighting the difficulties with representation in cognition as a general research topic. And “The Scientific Study of Passive Thinking” argues that self-report is a valid approach for collecting data on mind-wandering and suggests that theoretical models of phenomena can and do inform data collection techniques. (Perhaps oddly for a book on neuroscience and philosophy, except for passing mention, this chapter completely eschews neuroscientific approaches to identifying wandering minds.)

There is one exception to my description of this book as critiquing traditional philosophy of mind, and that is the final chapter. This is a straight philosophy article, written by two philosophers, on the possibility and potential for taxonomic pluralism across research programs. It is a slightly different take on how to understand the issue of theoretical reduction across psychology and neuroscience. The authors side with pluralism, as most contemporary philosophers of mind do these days.

In short: this volume reads as one in a long tradition of empirically minded philosophers talking to non-empirically minded philosophers about how they need to step up their game. It is all about science informing philosophy, which is a good thing for it to do, from my perspective (and what I’ve spent my entire career trying to illustrate).

But the directionality does not run very far in the opposite way. Nowhere are philosophical approaches really used to improve scientific practice or theorizing. This seems a bit of a wasted opportunity. Nevertheless, despite some chapters being conceptually more uneven than others, they are all interesting and pitched at the right level for philosophers to read and appreciate—and I highly recommend that philosophers of mind (and cognate areas) do so. For knowing how the brain works and how it shapes our various mental experiences is fundamental to getting philosophizing about ourselves right.