New Essays on Fichte's Later Jena Wissenschaftslehre

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Breazeale, Daniel and Rockmore, Tom (eds.), New Essays on Fichte's Later Jena Wissenschaftslehre, Northwestern, 2002, 360pp, $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 0810118653.

Reviewed by Michael Vater, Marquette University


This compilation of essays brings to the English-speaking world a rich sampling of European and North American scholarship on J.G. Fichte’s philosophical activity from 1795 to 1800. What most of the histories of philosophy recount as the Wissenschaftslehre is the hurriedly assembled and unbalanced presentation Fichte produced for his first lectures in Jena in 1794-1795, entitled Foundations of the Entire Science of Knowledge. In 1795-1796 Fichte laid out a legal philosophy, published in 1796-1797 as Foundations of Natural Right, which was based on the principles of the Wissenschaftslehre and seemed to revise his earlier thinking. Consciousness is no longer seen to be self-positing in an individualistic sense, but to include in its very basis intersubjectivity, or the mutual determination of a plurality of wills. Fichte continued the rethinking of his system when in 1796-1797 and two subsequent academic years he returned to the task of articulating the basic principles of human knowledge. The lectures—known as Wissenschaftslehre nova methodo— take a self-reflective or phenomenological approach to doing transcendental philosophy and turn away from the perplexing, quasi-foundational triple posits of the 1794-1795 version, and from its bifurcation of theoretical and practical philosophy and, underlying that, the duplicity of ’representation’ and ’feeling’. Breazeale’s Introduction takes pains to point out that scholarly opinion is divided on whether there is more continuity than difference between the earlier and later Jena systems.

Five essays on the more accessible Foundations of Natural Right open the volume, followed by seven on the nova methodo lectures. Another seven essays, addressing various themes in Fichte’s early works, conclude the volume. In a brief review, I can touch on only a few contributions in the first two sets. Fichte is a ’philosopher’s philosopher’ whose arguments are complicated and embedded in long theoretical traditions—both in epistemology and in jurisprudence. These essays are similarly technical, and a good many of them resolve apparent difficulties in Fichte’s arguments into more basic, but still insoluble quandaries. Fichte’s basic project—to give a wholly idealistic account of the feeling of objectivity that experience delivers—knowingly flirts with contradiction from the start in order to give an account of knowledge and action premised on primitive freedom or ’agility’.

Klaus Brinkmann explores the idea of the complementarity of human beings which Fichte builds into Natural Right in two related ideas: intersubjectivity and reciprocal recognition. Because the self-conscious individual can become conscious of her freedom or self-determination only through another consciousness, as agent she can act only with and against an other which is recognized as equally free and self-determining. Recognition presupposed intersubjectivity, though it is not reducible to it. Brinkmann concurs with Robert Williams and Vittorio Hösle that Fichte did not fully exploit the idea in moving from theoretical foundations to notoriously restrictive legal and political recommendations. He takes issue, however, with Fichte’s derivation of mutual recognition from the principle of intersubjectivity, especially with the ’summons’ (Aufforderung) whereby a second or ’outside’ rational being stimulates the potentially free being into active self-determination. The ’summons’ either involves a regress or simply begs the question about the social nature of consciousness. Brinkmann acknowledges that Fichte saw this dilemma and attempted to diffuse it by describing the ’summoner’ (or educating consciousness) as a “necessary fact” or simple condition of consciousness. The move, however, transforms an epistemic condition into an ontological one: only a transcendent other or ’unsummoned summoner’ could explain the human’s condition of being determined to be self-determining. But such an outside influence vitiates the intended idealism of Wissenschaftslehre, which, Fichte reasoned, must start with uncompromised or pure freedom to end with a plurality of rationally limited free beings.

Robert Williams focuses on what, from the point of view of later theory, is disappointing in Natural Right’s deployment of recognition, namely, the fact that it is supplanted by coercion as the conceptual basis of right and returns Fichte’s legal and social thinking to the egoistic bedrock of the Hobbesian contract tradition. What is novel in Fichte’s treatment of law is that it invokes the intertwined social- and self-conscious nature of the human as the primitive “fact of reason,” much the way Kant used the moral law as the ’factual’ basis of freedom. Williams does not see much problematic in Fichte’s march from a primitive act of imagination that conceives of rational agency as plural--and so lets me affirm my freedom only to the extent that I affirm the possibility of the other’s freedom—to the ’summons’, and from there to mutual recognition as embodied free agents in a physical world. What Williams finds disquieting is the displacement of this positive idea, used to define the concept of right, by the negative notion of coercion in the sections that concretely spell out juridical and political structures. Coercion seems to justify a preemptive exclusion of ’outsiders’ from the socially cohesive ’recognizers’; legislation is aimed at redressing the inevitable wrongs which arise in a world where trust and confidence have been irretrievably lost. Williams closes his essay with a look at Hegel’s criticisms of Fichte. In the Difference essay, Hegel takes Fichte to task for conceiving I and not-I as merely other, hence for conceiving freedom as fixed opposition rather than the transcending of opposition. In his Natural Law essay, Hegel criticizes Fichte for rationalizing only the external state, where public authority, state security, and criminality are the sole juridical and political concerns, not the positive expression of social freedom. The state based on penal redress (coercion) can see no farther than the surveillance camera.

Other essays explore more specific themes of Natural Right. Jean Christoph Merle considers Fichte’s theory of punishment. Despite its superficial resemblance to Beccaria’s and Bentham’s utilitarian arguments, Merle finds Fichte’s pragmatic standard of punishment—detain the criminal until she is improved, i.e., poses as much and as little a threat to the community as any other citizen—has good Kantian grounds. It uses coercive action to maintain the external coexistence of freedom among agents, and it treats the criminal as a moral agent or end in itself insofar as it punishes with the consent of the punished (who has an eye on the possibility of eventually restored legal freedom).

The essays on the Wissenschaftslehre nova methodo are comparative in nature; they look back to the 1794-1795 Foundations and wrestle with the question of whether the apparently new material of 1796-1799 is merely a different form of presentation or whether it represents an alteration of Fichte’s basic views.

Johannes Brachtendorf approaches the difference question head on. There are three elements or principles that ground the earlier Wissenschaftslehre: there is a foundational and presuppositionless first element that pervades all in virtue of its indeterminacy; a second introduces negation and so determinacy; a third extends the first two out to completeness or thoroughgoing determinacy. The 1794-1795 Foundations, however, offered no less than three accounts of how these elements work together: (1) The first account gives the familiar three principles of the opening sections, wherein I and not-I are synthesized in a third principle, which subsequent analysis shows to have more concrete, but still complex elements. (2) The second account abandons the unraveling of the ongoing I = not-I synthesis and instead resorts to the power of imagination (Ineinsbilding: identification) and the ’check’ to unite the infinite and the finite I. (3) The third attempt to go from completeness back to identity is the “practical philosophy,” wherein the I becomes a striving to annihilate its objective conditions. Brachtendorf believes the latter two fail because of Fichte’s implausible insistence on the ideality of the check; there is no way, he argues, that a principle of determinacy can be introduced that is not tied to external influence or original objectivity. The nova methodo lectures bypass these failed attempts to introduce determinacy into the indeterminate from the inside by eliminating the second element: negation, restriction, not-I, or ’check’. Immediate consciousness is the primary and indeterminate element, just as the I’s primordial activity was in the earlier version, but it is only potentially conscious. Real consciousness comes on the scene with self-reflection, and in self-reflection consciousness determines itself. The I and the not-I of the earlier Wissenschaftslehre become not opposed principles, but differing points of view upon the same consciousness: as active, consciousness is I; as passivity or rest, it is not-I, or ’being’ as Fichte most often calls it now. Though Fichte abandons the circular methodology of the 1794 Foundation, the new presentation showcases the function of ’imagination’—nondiscursive or holistic determination, in contract to the focused or local determination involved in conceptual thinking.

Brachtendorf’s discussion, clear as it is, illustrates the pitfalls that confront the Fichte scholar. Fichte is always between different versions and defenses of Wissenschaftslehre and usually works at his basic vision in a series of very intricate arguments. The critic is stuck with Fichte’s vocabulary and not quite plainly justified methodology and is at a loss to translate it into other terms and cognitive paradigms. Daniel Breazeale addresses that quandary with an attempt to fit an outside paradigm—the ’philosophical fiction’ as used by Salomon Maimon to interpret Leibniz’s philosophy—onto Fichte’s speculation. Critics have been used, claims Breazeale, to view Fichte either through ’constructivist’ or through ’phenomenological lenses’. Though one might want to view the author of the 1794-1795 Foundations as a constructivist and that of the Wissenschaftslehre nova methodo as a phenomenologist, things are not that simple. Part III of the 1794 Wissenschaftslehre proceeds descriptively, not deductively, and some of Fichte’s strongest foundationalist claims are presented in writings penned in 1800. Breazeale pursues the idea of interpreting Wissenschaftslehre in a third or ’middle’ way, wherein the large theoretical concepts of absolute I and not-I, or of consciousness as such and reflection, or freedom and limitation (whether in the guise of ’check’ or ’feeling’ or ’summons’) can be postulated, isolated and conceptually refined, and reintegrated in such a way that initially different concepts will come to be seen as reciprocal, and isolated elements be seen as part of a dialectically necessary totality. What this ’fictional method’ may show, says Breazeale, is not the truth, but only the necessary assumability of these items—”necessary, that is, if one wants to “make sense” of one’s own, profoundly divided being in the world.” At the end, however, Breazeale draws back from this thought experiment: Fichte made too many metaphilosophical claims about the existence of one true philosophy and consistently argued for the superiority of idealism over dogmatism. One cannot make such claims if one’s philosophy is merely one story among others.

In a difficult but valuable contribution, Günter Zöller swims against the stream that wants to dissolve all empirical selfhood into social relations. He suggests that the interpersonality or intersubjectivity that contemporary readers find so pertinent in the Wissenschaftslehre nova methodo is a derived or secondary social relationship, one that depends upon a proto-social relation between the individual (i.e., the finite rational being) and its locating or determining ground. To explain this, Zöller undertakes an account of the transcendental ground of individuality, as Fichte explained it in his later Jena writings. In Natural Right the free agent becomes self-determining and free in a social sense by appearing as a body within a material world wherein, as mediated through gesture and language, its freedom is secured by recognition and subsequently embodied in law—the coordination of the limited freedom of plural subjects. The individual is materialized, stresses Zöller, not by being embodied; its volitional limitation, freely self-determined, appears as its located body. The 1798 System of Ethics amplifies this view. Individuality is the result of self-objectifying subjectivity, of the I as striving. Fichte distinguished various strands of the ethical subject-in-situation: a ’natural drive’ which provides the content of willing, a ’pure drive’ which accounts for the reach of desire and conation, and the ’moral drive’ which is regarded as a product of the prior two. The ultimate goal of all striving and action is the reintegration of reason and nature. When it comes to finite actions, this means that the rational is to predominate over the particular in the rational person’s deeds, or that the moral world is willed identically by all agents. The ethical end of Fichte’s individual is to unite with its world in such a way that her difference and particularity are vanishing features. The account of individuality is deepened, however, in the 1796-1799 nova methodo lectures, where Fichte brings together the individuality of a person’s moral character and the social individuation that comes from location in a social milieu to forge the concept of ’pure willing’—the proto-cognitive and proto-volitional state which is postulated as the transcendental ground of subjectivity (and objectivity). For Fichte, the freedom of a rational being consists in ’thinking’, i.e., the production of a determination in a determinable basis (which itself is not given before the free determination). This ’thinking’ is without deliberation, without prior cognition; it is situating, not in situation. This seizing oneself out of the realm of all rational being is one’s ’main character’: the determination to self-determination that is both the nature and the act of the rational being. It appears empirically as the ’summons’, the socially mediated solicitation to rational existence, e.g., the education into human being that one’s family and social interactions provide. While for the individual, this being-summoned and the rational agents behind it take on the experiential guise of independent existence, on the philosophical level only the rational being itself is responsible for its adopting the stance of rationality. It is apparent, argues Zöller, that the dependence of one’s rationality upon its solicitation by another rational being finally explains nothing, that there must be an ultimate foundation for individuality, a call from some “solicitor general” to assume free existence. “No individual is able to account for itself on the basis of itself alone,” and so one is driven to philosophically postulate some supra-individual ground of individuality—the pure will that is identified with the “divine will” in the popular and theistically tinged Vocation of Man. The intersubjectivity or interpersonality, therefore, that characterized the construction of the finite I in the second Jena system is not the firm ground Fichte sought for Wissenschaftslehre. There is more continuity than discontinuity when, having left Jena, Fichte’s thought takes a theistic (if somewhat transcendentally problematic) turn.

One can see from these summaries that a great deal of sophisticated analysis is here dedicated to Fichte’s lesser known works, and that his contribution is not limited to the sudden, stellar appearance and swift subsequent implosion of the 1794-1795 Foundations. When one reads Fichte, one is plunged into a series of problems that seem to intensify just when they promise to open to solution. One is never quite sure whether one is dealing with Fichte’s problems (as a writer and theoretician) or with ’our’ problems as mental and material, individual and social, free and conditioned critters. But he never lets the thinker forget the ’and’.