New Essays on Peirce's Mathematical Philosophy

Placeholder book cover

Matthew E. Moore (ed.), New Essays on Peirce's Mathematical Philosophy, Open Court, 2010, 402pp., $89.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780812696813.

Reviewed by Stephen Pollard, Truman State University


Although this reviewer answered the call of duty and read the New Essays from cover to cover, there are five reasons why he cannot recommend that others do the same.

  1. 402 pages crammed with faint, tiny type cannot be good for anyone's eyes.
  2. There is enough overlap between the essays to discourage a line-by-line march to the finish. (Does anyone really need six introductions to the corollarial/theorematic distinction in the space of 173 pages?) In one case, a single page is enough to engender a feeling of déjà vu. Lines 2-4 of p. 272 read: "Non-Archimedean ordered fields, by contrast, always contain infinite as well as nonzero infinitesimal elements, the latter being the multiplicative inverses of the former." Lines 22-24 of the same page read: "Non-Archimedean ordered fields, by contrast, contain infinite as well as nonzero infinitesimal elements, the latter being the multiplicative inverses of the former."
  3. Edited volumes of previously unpublished essays have an upside and a downside. Freed from the heavy hand of referees, some contributors produce creative work with a distinctive flair; others lengthen their vitas with output below their usual standard. True to form, some of the New Essays are, let us say, unimpressive.
  4. Furthermore, this reviewer was unable to form a definite judgment about another of the essays because he found it largely unintelligible. Here is a sample (214). "The elementary axioms of the basic system of existential graphs thus support the idea -- central in philosophy (Presocratics, Peirce, Heidegger) -- that a first self-reflection of nothingness on itself is the spark that ignites the evolution of knowledge." Readers who find this sort of thing suggestive or inspiring should, by all means, dig in.
  5. Yet another essay, though admirable in some respects, casts Peirce as little more than a spear-carrier. In the first 21 pages, the author cites Peirce only six times while citing himself 67 times. Peirce rallies a bit in the last 26 pages, but cannot overcome the author's early advantage. The final tally: Peirce citations 22, self-citations 97. These numbers give an accurate impression of the essay's focus. This might not please those readers who peruse the New Essays on Peirce's Mathematical Philosophy because they are interested in Peirce's mathematical philosophy.

To discourage readers from studying every word of a fat edited volume is, perhaps, to praise it by rather faint damnation. Indeed, this reviewer read seven of the New Essays with pleasure and profit. Here are some observations about six of those that this reviewer feels competent to discuss.

In "'The form of a relation': Peirce and Mathematical Structuralism," Christopher Hookway argues that "Peirce's philosophical view of mathematics has many significant resemblances to contemporary structuralism" (38). Suppose Ernst is taller than David; David is not taller than Ernst; Ernst is not taller than Ernst; David is not taller than David. Here we are describing two existents (Ernst and David), two physical objects that interact physically with other physical objects. We could now apply hypostatic abstraction ("the chief engine of mathematical thought") and treat the relation between Ernst and David as a further object of study. We might observe, for example, that the taller-than relation is irreflexive and asymmetric. Or we might note that the taller-than relation relates Ernst and David thus:

Ernst David

It might occur to us that the heavier-than relation relates Frank to John thus:

Frank John

That is, the heavier-than relation relates Frank to John in the same way that the taller-than relation relates Ernst to David. Another hypostatic abstraction could then make ways of relating into further objects of study. We might observe that every asymmetric, irreflexive relation between two objects relates those objects thus:

This is one way of relating; it is the form such a relation takes. We are now poised to study certain forms of relation or abstract structures: in the present case, directed graphs. These structures are not existents: they are not physical objects that interact physically with other physical objects. They are nonetheless real because we can make true claims about them. To quote Peirce (35), their reality "merely consists in the truth of some proposition concerning a more primary substance." The directed graph with two vertices and one arrow is real because it is the form in which the taller-than relation relates Ernst to David and we can make true claims about the form of their relationship. When mathematicians inspect a diagram such as

the object of investigation is the form of a relation, a structure instantiated by the diagram and by other structured existents. These existents are, presumably, the "more primary" substances from which the abstract graph derives its reality. On the other hand, Peirce insists, "Mathematics is the study of what is true of hypothetical states of things" (31). It would betray an un-mathematical cast of mind if someone checked to see whether there are 10100 existents before investigating an abstract graph with 10100 vertices. All that matters to a mathematician is that such a structure be possible. But if there are no structured existents instantiating a graph with 10100 vertices, how could the reality of the graph consist in the truth of a proposition about "a more primary substance"? Is Peirce suggesting that our devil-may-care mathematician will be investigating something unreal? As Hookway notes, "It is not easy to sort out just where Peirce stands on these issues" (31). Hookway's own suggestion is that rules determine what properties a possible structure would have if it were to exist. A non-existent will then be real if there are rules that make certain claims about it true.

This reviewer found Claudine Tiercelin's "Peirce on Mathematical Objects and Mathematical Objectivity" easier to admire than to summarize. Here is Matthew Moore's attempt (9): "Tiercelin gives us a very detailed and nuanced account of the distinctive strengths of Peirce's philosophy of mathematics, and exhibits the roots of those strengths in his general accounts of reasoning and perception." On the subject of perception, Peirce maintains, "perceptual judgments contain general elements" insofar as "universal propositions are deducible from them" (97). In mathematics, the objects of perception are diagrams and the actions we perform on those diagrams. Our observations show us that any existents that are structured in a certain way will have certain properties; "more marvelously yet" they show us that existents that were structured in a certain way would have certain properties (100). Diagrammatic reasoning shows what must be the case in situations that are merely possible. It also establishes that certain situations are logically possible (101). Tiercelin's development of these themes is clear and well supported.

In "The Imagination and Hypothesis-Making in Mathematics," Daniel G. Campos explores Peirce's views on the role of imagination in mathematical reasoning. Imagination, says Peirce, is "the power of distinctly picturing to ourselves intricate configurations" (128). Peirce describes mathematical diagrams as "mental images," products of the imagination, that signify forms of relations by instantiating them (126-127). "A drawing or model may be employed to aid the imagination; but the essential thing to be performed is the act of imagining" (126). In its "originative function," imagination supplies us with a picture of a "hypothetical state of things": it supplies a diagram (129). But then, "It is necessary that something should be DONE" (130). Here imagination plays a "transformative" role (129). We exercise imagination to picture intricate configurations and to act on them. Mathematical reasoning, says Campos, necessarily involves "the creative, experimental work of the imagination" that operates on diagrams in order to display "the forms of novel general relations" (136, 142). This reviewer supposes that, for example, when we represent a real number to ourselves as a repeating decimal 0.123123…, Peirce would say we are employing a diagram. If called upon to show that this number is rational, we might (if sufficiently imaginative) act on this diagram as follows:

999 x 0.123123 … = (103 - 1) x 0.123123 … = 123.123123 … -0.123123 = 123

One more manipulation

0.123123 … = 123/999

and we are done. The diagram 0.123123… signifies a form of relation by indicating a position in the continuum of real numbers. We might say it signifies the distinctive form of relation that holds between one particular position in the number line and all other positions. Our proof shows that the diagrams

0.123123 … , 123/999

signify the same form of relation. It is not so clear, though, that these diagrams instantiate this form of relation. Is it even clear what that would mean in this case?

In her lucid essay on "Observing Signs," Susanna Marietti argues that "the whole of Peirce's philosophy of mathematics" follows from these theses: (1) "Mathematical knowledge comes from observation;" (2) "what we observe while doing mathematics are signs;" (3) "reasoning mathematically means observing signs for a definite purpose;" (4) that purpose is to acquire knowledge about the relations represented by the signs; (5) diagrams, the signs observed by mathematicians, make these relations perceptible "through corresponding concrete relations between the elements of the diagram;" (6) those concrete relations are perceptible because they are spatiotemporal, in particular, they are a matter of juxtapositions (147-149, 160).

As Marietti emphasizes, mathematicians do not just observe diagrams: they create them and act on them, rearranging existing elements and adding new ones. But the point of creating and manipulating diagrams is to observe the results of those activities and, thereby, learn something new about the relations represented by the diagrams. When we observe the diagram 0.123123… we perceive its material parts (seven numeral tokens, one token decimal point, one token ellipsis) and the juxtaposition of those parts (a token '0' to the far left followed immediately by a token '1', etc.). These juxtapositions carry information about a particular position on the number line. For example, the initial '0' immediately followed by the decimal point immediately followed by the '1' tell us our target is no greater than two tenths and no less than one tenth. The terminal ellipsis tells us to continue our search according to a well-defined rule. When we juxtapose nine tokens of the indicated types in the indicated way we signify a form of relation: the form of the relation that holds between a particular point on the real number line and all the other points. Fair enough. What seems dubious is the claim that "the form of the relation investigated … is the very form of the relation between the … corresponding parts of the diagram" (158). It is not even clear what the "correspondence" would be in this case.

In "Peirce's General Theory of Inquiry and the Problem of Mathematics," Elizabeth F. Cooke asks how mathematics can "make progress in its inquiry into the logically possible" (171). In natural science, physical reality "provides resistance to our false beliefs" (169) causing "the irritation of doubt" (181). One wonders how physical reality could constrain mathematicians in this way if, as Peirce says, "mathematics studies what is and what is not logically possible, without making itself responsible for its actual existence" (180). Since "Peirce's general theory of inquiry requires such a constraint as a self-corrective to inquiry," he must "somehow explain how minds can come into contact with what is logically possible, but not actual" (185). When a diagram instantiates a certain form of relation, we can see that the form is logically possible because we can see that it is actual. We can see that a graph of the form

is logically possible when (as now) we are looking at such a graph. It is not so clear how our manipulation of diagrams can establish the logical possibility of a form of relation when none of those diagrams instantiate that form. Part of the answer seems to be that a diagram can represent a logically possible situation without actualizing it. We understand how it does this representing when we understand which manipulations of it are permissible. Such manipulations can play the error-correcting role of scientific observations or experiments. Suppose someone believes that a point in the real number line situated thus … nknl … nknl … nk

(i.e., with that sort of decimal representation) can be irrational. A few choice manipulations will display the impossibility of such a situation. Indeed, … nknl … nknl … nk … = (nl … nk)/(10k - 1)

Our manipulations also show that something is logically possible: namely, the rationality of a number represented by a non-terminating decimal. Or, rather, that is what they show as long as our practice of manipulating decimal representations is itself coherent. Since verifying that amounts to verifying a statement undecidable in second-order arithmetic, it is hard to see how such verification could take the form of a manipulation of diagrams. Cooke remarks, "even if mathematics studies 'mere' hypotheses, it still checks these with an external reality represented in the diagram" (192). It is plausible that a long history of intelligent, reflective manipulations of diagrams could supply strong evidence of the coherence of that very practice of manipulation. In the most interesting cases, though, there is no serious prospect that such evidence will amount to a proof that the forms of relation at issue are logically possible.

In the first part of "Peirce's Cantor," Matthew E. Moore offers "an initial attempt" at "a careful accounting of which of Cantor's works Peirce read, and of how he interpreted them" (324). Moore's exposition is clear and his arguments convincing. He finds that "Peirce's comparisons of his work with Cantor's … are typically distorted by a desire to tell the story in such a way as to preserve Peirce's pre-eminence, but to do so (impossibly) without blatantly disregarding the facts" (341). Moore's historical and hermeneutic work serves his "ultimate aim … to enhance our appreciation of Peirce's philosophy of set theory" (323). In the second part of his essay, Moore addresses this topic more directly, arguing that "Peirce's systematically grounded approach to set-theoretic ontology is an untapped resource for us as we seek to articulate and defend the distinctive freedom of the mathematician" (353). This seems perverse. What would best justify the freewheeling antics of mathematicians is not an ontology but Peirce's doctrine that mathematics has no ontology. "The whole science of mathematics is a science of hypotheses; so that nothing could be more completely abstracted from concrete reality" (361). Any sets or collections that do or might exist are of mathematical interest only insofar as they do or would exemplify interesting forms of relation. Ernst and his singleton are related thus:

Ernst {Ernst}

Any further elaboration of the nature of this relationship seems mathematically irrelevant. Mathematical set theories describe certain structures with mathematically interesting properties. Suppose we insist that these structures conform to an extra-mathematical notion of collection such as Peirce himself developed. It is obscure how this could constitute a defense of mathematical freedom and it remains obscure even if we allow collections to be mere possibilities.

An extra-mathematical theory of collections might enrich mathematics by drawing attention to new forms of relation. This would give mathematicians a new way to exercise their freedom. It is not an argument that they should be free. (A gift of a bullhorn is not a philosophical defense of free speech even though it might help people speak more effectively.) Moore gives the following example of how Peirce's philosophy justifies pluralism in mathematics (353-354):

The mathematician as such is free to study set theoretic universes in which every set is constructible, as well as universes in which this is not so. Hypostatic abstraction, as a general account of mathematical ontology, gives further depth and nuance to this robust conception of the mathematician's freedom.

This example is not so well chosen. It would reek of fanaticism if a skeptic about the axiom of constructibility were to discourage colleagues from studying constructible sets. This would be like a herpetologist condemning the special study of snakes because some herptiles are not snakes. Suppose, on the other hand, I believe in ZFC+V=L. (ZFC is a standard axiomatization of set theory. V=L is the proposition that all sets are constructible.) Although this case is less clear-cut, the following argument is worth considering. Since I believe in ZFC+V=L, I must also believe that a constructible set is a model of ZFC+V≠L. (ZFC+V≠L is consistent if ZFC is and any consistent first-order theory has a set model.) Since this means I can interpret work in ZFC+V≠L as an investigation into a part of my own universe, there is no need for the philosophers to convince me that such work is mathematically respectable. Such grumblings aside, this reviewer appreciated Moore's honesty and clarity and did learn from his essay. Moore also deserves praise for organizing a volume of generally high quality (and remarkably few misprints).