New Essays on Singular Thought

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Robin Jeshion (ed.), New Essays on Singular Thought, Oxford University Press, 2010, 324pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199567881.

Reviewed by Dilip Ninan, University of St Andrews


This volume contains ten previously unpublished essays by a variety of authors, each dealing with some aspect of the phenomenon of singular thought. It begins with a helpful introduction by the editor, and the subsequent essays are divided thematically into four sections. The first set of essays all deal with the nature of singular thought and what distinguishes it from descriptive thought. The second set is about what it takes to possess a singular thought about an object. The third set concerns perception- and communication-based singular thought. The final set focuses on the relationship between singular thoughts and thoughts about fictional and other (putatively) non-existent things. The volume is an important new resource for anyone interested in the topic of singular thought.

A singular thought is a thought that is, in some sense, 'directly about' an individual: for example, the thought that that man [I point] is over six feet tall is said to be directly about the man in question. The contrast here is with descriptive or general thoughts which are said to be about individuals only in a more attenuated sense. If I believe, on the basis of rather general considerations, that the tallest man in Denmark is over six feet tall, my thought is about the man who satisfies that description (assuming that there is one) in only a loose sense. Many philosophers -- including most of the writers in Jeshion's volume -- think that this distinction corresponds to a distinction between two kinds of content. A well-known view of this sort is held by neo-Russellians who take a singular content to be a structured proposition that contains an individual as a constituent.

One question addressed by several writers in the volume concerns the relation that a thinker must bear to an object in order to have a singular thought about it. Although the section of the book devoted to this issue ("Conditions on Singular Thought") contains only two essays, the issue comes up in six of the other eight essays. Like most contemporary philosophers working on this topic, the authors in this volume tend to reject Russell's well-known claim that having a singular thought about an individual requires the thinker to be acquainted with that individual, where Russellian acquaintance is an extremely demanding sort of relation that we generally do not bear to ordinary objects. But the authors differ on what they think ought to replace Russellian acquaintance.

In his contribution ("Getting a Thing into a Thought"), Kent Bach argues that singular thought is ultimately rooted in perception: current perception, memory (past perception), and testimony (others' perception) all put one in a position to have singular thoughts about an individual. This gives us some sufficient conditions for when an agent is in a position to have singular thoughts about an object, but no necessary conditions, as Bach concedes. Instead of "acquaintance", Bach calls the relation that underwrites singular thought "the representation connection" and asks: "Is the representation connection relation even more inclusive than this? Unfortunately, I have never been able to find a principled answer to this question." (p. 58).

Nathan Salmon also touches on this issue in his piece "Three Perspectives on Quantifying In". Simplifying slightly, Salmon's view is that a thinker using a concept c that designates an individual x can have singular thoughts about x only if c is a name of x. Salmon draws the relevant notion of 'being a name of' from Kaplan's paper "Quantifying In" (Kaplan 1968). The crucial feature of this special naming relation is that "it is not merely a matter of fit . . . but a matter of a real connection -- on the analogy of a photograph being a picture of an object" (p. 68). Thus, Salmon appears to be endorsing the well-known idea that singular thought is subject to a causal constraint: a thinker can have a singular thought about an individual only if he or she is appropriately causally related to that individual. Many authors continue to use the term "acquaintance" for this causal relation; in that terminology, Salmon thinks singular thought requires acquaintance. Salmon's essay also usefully highlights some points of connection between the older Quine-and-Kaplan-inspired discussion of de re attitude reports and more contemporary discussions of singular thought.

Since Salmon adopts a causal constraint on singular thought, it is no surprise that he rejects the thesis that Robin Jeshion calls "Semantic Instrumentalism" in her essay "Singular Thought: Acquaintance, Semantic Instrumentalism, and Cognitivism". Suppose that there will be a unique first child born in the twenty-second century, and that I stipulate that "Newman1" is to name the first child to be born in the twenty-second century (the example is due to Kaplan (1977)). Semantic Instrumentalism is the view that this act of stipulation puts me in a position to have singular thoughts about the child in question. Jeshion agrees with Salmon that Semantic Instrumentalism is false, but she nevertheless holds that there are cases of singular thought without acquaintance. In one of her examples, she and her family are setting up their campsite when they notice the footprints of a grown male bear along with some fresh bear scat. Not wanting to camp in the vicinity of a bear, Jeshion says to her husband, "I think we should get off his turf." (p. 117)

Jeshion thinks this is a case in which she has singular thoughts about the bear despite not being acquainted with it. Jeshion uses cases like this to motivate an interesting positive view. On her account, an agent can have a singular thought about an individual if that individual is "significant to the agent with respect to her plans, projects, affective states, motivations." (p. 136) So even though she is not acquainted with the bear, she can have singular thoughts about it given its significance to her decision about where to pitch her tent.

Even if we are prepared to accept the judgment that Jeshion is in a position to have singular thoughts about the bear, it is unclear whether or not this is a counterexample to the acquaintance requirement. For, in the example, Jeshion is causally related to the bear via the evidence he has left behind -- why isn't that enough for Jeshion to count as being acquainted with the bear? If it isn't enough, can't the acquaintance theorist simply re-define that notion so that it includes weak causal links like this? "Acquaintance" is, after all, a term of art in these discussions. Such a weakened acquaintance requirement is not trivial, since it rules out Semantic Instrumentalism, along with latitudinarianism, the view that if there is a unique F and one believes this, then one is in a position to have de re beliefs about the F.

Of course, we might be able to settle the issue between the (weakened) acquaintance thesis and Jeshion's view (which she calls "Cognitivism") by examining more of her cases. But, as François Recanati points out in "Singular Thought: In Defence of Acquaintance", we quickly run into a problem that often arises when using the 'method of cases' in philosophy: our intuitions about the relevant cases are not particularly robust. Am I able to have singular thoughts about Newman1? Does Jeshion have singular thoughts about the bear near her campsite? Did Leverrier have singular thoughts about Neptune (having hypothesized the existence of such a planet only on the basis of facts about the orbit of Uranus)? It is not easy to settle these cases via direct intuition since it is often unclear what the intuitively correct thing to say about the cases is. Having highlighted this problem, Recanati goes on to discuss a methodological proposal put forward by John Hawthorne and David Manley in a forthcoming book. Their proposal is that any belief report whose complement clause contains either a singular term or a variable bound from outside by an existential quantifier requires for its truth that the subject have a singular thought. Recanati agrees with Hawthorne and Manley that if this proposal is adopted, then the prospects for any sort of acquaintance thesis are dim. Recanati offers this example to illustrate this point:

Ann is a six-year-old girl whom John has never met and whose existence he is unaware of. But John believes that every six-year-old can learn to play tennis in ten lessons. So, meeting Ann, I tell her: John believes that you can play tennis in ten lessons. (p. 168)

Recanati concedes that there is a sense in which this belief report is true, which, by Hawthorne and Manley's principle, means that John has a singular belief about Ann despite not being acquainted with her in any sense. But Recanati thinks that this constitutes something of a reductio of Hawthorne and Manley's proposal, since if John counts as having a singular belief about Ann, then we lose the very distinction that we were initially attempting to characterize -- the distinction between singular and general thought.

But if we do not rely on this linguistic characterization of singular thought, what is the alternative? Recanati suggests that we can use the notion of a 'mental file' in providing a cognitive characterization of singular thought that is "independent of our reporting practices." (p. 169) For Recanati, a mental file is an internal representation that an agent uses to keep track of an object that he or she encounters. A mental file is always 'based on' a particular acquaintance relation: for example, my mental file for the woman I see walking down the street is based on the perceptual relation I bear to her. A singular thought, then, is simply a thought one has in virtue of possessing the appropriate sort of mental file. But this picture threatens to trivialize the claim that singular thought requires acquaintance: a singular thought is thinking 'through' a mental file, and a mental file just is an internal representation that is based on an acquaintance relation. So it follows almost by definition that singular thought requires acquaintance. There is nothing wrong about this, but if this is what we mean by "singular thought" then there can be no controversy over the claim that singular thought requires acquaintance.

Recanati has much more to say about the notion of a mental file, as do several other authors in this volume (Bach, Kenneth Taylor, Jeshion, Imogen Dickie, Manuel García-Carpintero). It appears that the notion of a mental file is likely to continue to play an important role in future discussions of singular thought.

Taylor, Jeshion, and R.M. Sainsbury all discuss the issue of singular (or singular-like) thoughts that lack objects. In his contribution ("Intentionality without Exotica"), Sainsbury calls singular thoughts with objects "externally singular" and those without "internally singular". He illustrates the distinction by reference to Quine's example, "Jacks wants a sloop." Jack's desire is externally singular if there is a particular sloop that Jack wants; this is Quine's "relational" reading. Quine's "notional" reading reports a wholly non-specific desire: Jack desires mere relief from slooplessness. But Sainsbury notes that the sentence might also be read as reporting an internally singular desire: Jack has told the ship builders what his sloop -- which he has dubbed "The Mary Jane" -- should be like in great detail; Jacks wants that sloop and only that one. But tragedy strikes and The Mary Jane is never built. Thus, there is no concrete object that serves as the object of Jack's desire, despite the fact that his desire is quite specific. Taylor's essay ("On Singularity") also emphasizes this important point which is often overlooked in the philosophy of language and mind. Specificity and 'relationality' are not the same thing.

Let me briefly describe the remaining essays in the volume, which constraints of space prevent me from discussing in more detail. In "Demonstrative Reference, the Relational View of Experience, and the Proximality Principle," John Campbell defends the relational view of experience from Tyler Burge's objection to that the relational view conflicts with the results of vision science. In "We are Acquainted with Ordinary Things", Dickie uses evidence from empirical psychology to discredit the Russellian view that we are not acquainted with ordinary middle-sized objects. In "Millian Externalism", Arthur Sullivan provides a critical discussion of the claim that adopting an externalist approach to reference entails a very liberal conception of singular thought. In "Fictional Singular Imaginings", García-Carpintero defends a descriptivist-friendly view of singular thought. But he approaches the issue somewhat indirectly, by first studying the role of referential expressions in fictional discourse.


Hawthorne, John and David Manley (forthcoming). The Reference Book. Oxford University Press.

Kaplan, David (1968). "Quantifying In." Synthese 19 (1-2):178-214.

Kaplan, David (1970). "Dthat." Syntax and Semantics 9:221-43.