New Foundations for Physical Geometry: The Theory of Linear Structures

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Tim Maudlin, New Foundations for Physical Geometry: The Theory of Linear Structures, Oxford University Press, 2014, 363pp., $75.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198701309.

Reviewed by Dennis Dieks, Utrecht University


This is an impressive book. I also find it idiosyncratic in places, occasionally even irritating. It is impressive because Maudlin develops his own, new and independent, foundational scheme for geometry. Not only does he propose new principles, he elaborates them to such a degree that a serious alternative to traditional approaches begins to take shape. I think that this result, and the enthusiasm, energy and persistence displayed in the enterprise, deserve admiration. The book strikes me as strange in places, with cavalier claims that seem exaggerated, inaccurate, or sometimes even false. Maudlin explains and develops his new approach in a polemical style, with much emphasis on a supposed inadequacy of standard mathematical notions, which are depicted as in outright conflict with common sense and the "fundamental essences" of the concepts that are to be formalized. I think the use of these rhetorical ploys injects an element of controversy that detracts from the book's considerable positive achievements.

In the Introduction Maudlin explains that this is the first of two books, which together will bear the fruits of an extensive and long-term research project on the foundations of physical geometry. The second book will focus on the physical foundations of spacetime. Maudlin promises us that it will provide a justification for this first volume in the sense that the new mathematical ideas and methods developed here will turn out to be convenient, natural, and perhaps even indispensable there. Since the second book has not yet appeared, however, it is impossible to put the first one in full perspective. Nevertheless,from remarks in this first volume we can  glean an impression of the general plan of the project. Maudlin states his leading idea in the Introduction as follows: "What endows spacetime with its geometry is time." Further, "the most fundamental geometrical structure that organizes physical points into a space is the line." I take it that these two principles, taken together, are meant to imply that the progress of time bundles physical events into histories that are linearly ordered (by time, or proper time in relativity). Idealizing, we thus arrive at the notion of a worldline or perhaps more generally a series of point-events that are linearly ordered in time. The resulting collection of fibers forms a fabric that holds spacetime together. In other words, the linear structure of (partial) time order creates a connected whole of lines, a space to which geometrical notions apply.

The basic idea is not unfamiliar: it reminds one of the program pioneered by Robb and elaborated in various ways since. At first sight then, there is room for skepticism about the question whether a program of this kind needs the development of new mathematical foundations. Indeed, it would appear from already existing work that this sort of analysis can very well be made within standard mathematics. However, the evaluation of the physical and philosophical advantages of a reconstruction of our geometrical conceptual framework is best delayed until we have Maudlin's projected second volume.

In the current book, Maudlin restricts himself to the purely mathematical side of his project: he sets himself the task of constructing a mathematical geometry, starting from a set of points to which lines are added in order to create a coherent space. Now, there already is a standard way of getting from a mere set of isolated points to a space with relations between the points, with the first beginnings of a geometrical structure, namely via the introduction of a topology. However, Maudlin rejects this traditional approach; let us see why.

The core idea of topology is to define neighborhood relations between the points in a set by organizing them in open subsets that are required to satisfy some simple conditions: the complete set and the empty set are defined to be open, and unions and finite intersections of open sets are defined to be open as well. The complement of an open set is called closed. Of course, there are certain intended applications and intuitions that motivate these definitions. Open and closed intervals on the line of real numbers, like (0,1) and [0,1], are well known from analysis, and these are taken as paradigmatic instances of topological neighborhoods. Topology, like mathematics in general, abstracts from such paradigm cases and seeks general and simple conceptual frameworks; this frequently leads to general results that were not expected on the basis of the motivating examples. Indeed, the topological framework resulting from the above simple definitions allows that some sets are both open and closed. Consider, to see a non-trivial example of this, the two open subsets in the set of rational numbers whose members have squares less than and greater than 2, respectively. These two sets are each other's complements, so both of them are open and closed.

Maudlin finds this unpalatable. Many other central results of standard topology he judges to be even more distasteful. Maudlin's typical argumentative strategy in such cases is to invoke intuitions about the fundamental essences of the notions under discussion -- in this specific case the notion of "openness". He often takes these intuitions of essences from appropriate Wikipedia articles; in our example "openness" of a set is found to mean that the elements of the set can "wiggle around", whereas "closed" means that there is no such "wiggling space" for all members of the set. Therefore, an open set cannot be closed (which after all is the negation of open). The next rhetorical step is to admit that the argument is not completely conclusive: intuitions may differ, mathematicians who have got accustomed to standard topology may disagree, and from a purely formal point of view one might maintain that notions can be defined as one wishes. But still: clear thinking is helped by clear concepts! A chapter later we then read that, as we have seen before, standard topology is unacceptable on the point in question.

Standard topology introduces precise definitions of many concepts that also have an intuitive content, for example the notion of connectedness. A set is defined to be connected if it is not the union of two disjoint non-empty open sets. It follows from this definition that the set of all rational numbers is disconnected because it is the union of the two open subsets defined a moment ago (one might say that the number √2 is missing from the set of rationals, which creates a "gap"). Another important concept is that of continuity: a mapping between two sets that are both equipped with a topology is called continuous if any open set in the target set is the image of an open set in the domain set. This generalizes the usual definition of a continuous function defined on the real numbers, according to which small intervals in the input variable should correspond to small changes in the output.

In both cases Maudlin objects. He argues that the essence of connectedness is that in a connected space it should be possible to go along the points in the space, respecting their natural order, without any jumps or interruptions; and this is clearly possible in the case of the rational numbers. There is a linear ordering among the rationals (the "greater than" relation), and one can walk along the rational line in the direction of this ordering without skipping any point on the line. So the set of rationals should be deemed connected.

In the same vein, Maudlin argues that the essence of continuity of a function is that the function's graph can be drawn without ever lifting the pencil from the paper. But the standard mathematical concept of continuity is different: the famous ε,δ-definition only says that small variations in the domain of the independent variable go together with small variations in the range of the function. Weierstrass and Dirichlet have already pointed out that according to this ε,δ-definition small (converging) jumps in the values of the function are compatible with the function's continuity. Maudlin, however, draws a different conclusion, namely that the standard definition is simply wrong: it defines convergence rather than continuity. Accordingly he proposes a new formal notion of continuity, whose core idea is that a function is continuous if it maps a linear order in its domain to connected pieces of linear order in the function's range (so that a motion of the pencil along the linearly ordered values of the independent variable is mapped into an uninterrupted series of function values, without gaps or jumps; see page 186 ff., "The Essence of Continuity").

These alternative definitions are certainly not nonsensical. They will of course lead to different verdicts about connectedness and continuity than the standard definitions. Whether these differences will be more than verbal quibbles will depend on the role the new conceptual framework will play in its application to physical spacetime in Maudlin's second volume.

Maudlin's proposals start from the supposition that a structure of linear orderings is given as a basis; as we already know, this is motivated by the idea that temporal ordering grounds physical geometry. Standard topology, by contrast, operates at a higher level of generality. It does not presuppose anything beyond the set-theoretical structure of the points in a topological space. That does not mean, of course, that standard topology cannot be combined with additional structure. For example, a distance function can be added, which leads to metric spaces as employed in physics. In this case the distance function is usually employed to define the open sets of the topology so that a natural link between the different levels of structure arises. It is also possible to add structure without going all the way to a metric space, for example by imposing a betweenness relation, affine structure or a linear ordering between points. So from the mathematical point of view there is not one unique level of "submetric geometry" and we do not have to think that there is a conflict between standard topological notions and what can be constructed from richer structures.

For Maudlin, however, lines form the rock-bottom on which the whole edifice of geometry should be erected, to the exclusion of open sets or other prior standard topological notions. It is a remarkable feat that he indeed succeeds in implementing this by developing a fully-fledged and independent route to geometry. The basic idea is, of course, to postulate the existence of subsets of points that display a linear order. In standard topology we have axioms and definitions regimenting open and closed sets, and Maudlin likewise lays down axioms for linear order and definitions for when lines (collections of points along which a linear order is defined) are open and closed (lines are open if they do not return on themselves and so do not form loops). Examples of further stipulations are that: each line contains at least two points; intervals of a linear order are themselves lines; two lines sharing one endpoint can be "spliced" so as to form one line; and the result of an infinite splicing of lines is also a line. This finally leads to what Maudlin calls a Point-Spliced Linear Structure. Important distinctions now come from the characteristics of the linear order: this order may be dense (if there is a point between every pair of points); complete, if every subset that has an upper bound has a least upper bound; and discrete if between any two points there are only finitely many other points. This then motivates the following definitions: a linear structure is a discrete space if each line in it possesses a discrete linear order; a linear structure is a continuum if each line has an order that is dense and complete; and a linear structure is rational if the linear orders are all dense but not complete.

These definitions of course remind us of number-theoretic notions. However, Maudlin stresses that the spaces that he is considering are real spaces, namely spaces that are essentially spaces rather than metaphorical spaces like the real number line or R3. In the latter case the "points" are not real points, but triples of numbers; and we should be aware that the nature of a number is different from the nature of a point. So numbers only serve, in this context, as expedient labels and should not be mistaken for the real thing. Maudlin combines this essentialist warning with the observation (in his Introduction) that negative and irrational numbers are very recent inventions anyway; surprisingly, he claims that their existence as bona fide mathematical objects was not yet recognized as late as 1842 (p. 19).

However this may be, the framework of Point-Spliced Linear Structures can be used to define the notions of neighborhood and open sets. A set of points is a neighborhood of a point p if the set contains p and every line with p as an endpoint has a segment in the set, with p as an endpoint. And a set in a linear structure is open if it is a neighborhood for all of its members. This then seems a natural place to combine forces with traditional ideas by identifying these "linear" open sets with the open sets of standard topology. Indeed, Maudlin shows that most topologies can be retrieved this way from possible linear structures (the ones for which this is not possible he calls "geometrically uninterpretable"). But this connection with standard topology forms only a marginal comment. Clearly, the linear structures contain more information than the collections of open sets that can be derived from them. More importantly, we have already seen that standard topology according to Maudlin works with a number of basically incorrect concepts. Still, one is inclined to say that since the standard topological framework is compatible with the existence of linear orderings among the points, the same mathematical states of affairs should be describable -- albeit in different terms (so that, e.g., in some cases "continuous mappings" will be Maudlin-discontinuous, etc.).

After the groundwork, the second half of the book (chapters 6-9) further develops the theory of linear structures to a level of considerable sophistication. Straightness of lines and differentiability are defined, and metrical structure is introduced via congruence and comparison of line ratios -- even fiber bundles are discussed. The last chapter compares continuous and discrete spaces. In fact, one of the advantages that Maudlin claims for his approach is that it provides us with a natural and intuitive treatment of discrete spaces in which functions on such spaces can be continuous and in which the spaces themselves can be connected even if standard topological verdicts are different (we have already seen the role of adapted definitions of continuity and connectedness in this). The linear structures approach could thus constitute a stepping stone to a mathematically satisfactory version of the intuition that a non-continuous space can approximate a continuum. And this may well be important from a physical point of view as ideas about a possible discrete structure of spacetime are widespread in present-day theoretical physics.

As in the first half, this part contains controversial statements alongside interesting elaborations and surprising results -- the latter partly due to the introduction of non-standard definitions. For example, the direction of a line in a point p is defined as the equivalence class of lines that have p as an endpoint and that share a segment (from p) with the original line. The consequence is that a curve and its tangent generally do not have the same direction in the point where the tangent touches the curve: there will generally not be a shared initial segment. This invites reflection about the angle between these two non-identical directions. More controversially, perhaps, chapter 6 opens with a curious argument intended to show that distances cannot be geometrically primitive but must depend on the existence of lines even from a purely mathematical viewpoint. For suppose, so the argument goes, that distances are just numbers assigned to pairs of points (as usually assumed). Then think of three-dimensional Euclidean space, with all its distances between points, and remove all points except those lying on two detached planes. In the resulting geometrical structure these two planes will have an induced internal Euclidean plane geometry, which is okay, but they will also have distances with respect to each other. But since the planes are now the only things that exist and have nothing in between them, it is absurd to think that they could have distances with respect to each other, Maudlin says. A somewhat similar argument is subsequently used to expose a "disaster" for topology if it is not based on lines: the usual topology for three-dimensional space, defined by the open balls of the metric, does not reduce to the usual topology of the planes because the open disks in a plane do not belong to the set of open balls.

In the same chapter 6 there is a long and strange exegetical discussion of what Euclid could have meant with his second postulate, quoted by Maudlin as "To produce a straight line continuously in a straight line". Clearly, Maudlin says, Euclid cannot mean that every straight line can be made longer: for example, the x-axis cannot be made longer than it already is. However, in reality the second postulate reads "To produce a finite straight line continuously in a straight line" and is misquoted by Maudlin who leaves out "finite" (πεπερασμένη). Similarly, in chapter 7 there is a long and rather pretentious digression on the interpretation of Euclid's proof of the side-angle-side congruence theorem for triangles, which betrays unfamiliarity with the history of mathematics literature on the "method of superposition".

When we cut out the unnecessary frills, what remains is a remarkable achievement: a worked-out formal framework for geometry based on the concept of (partial) linear ordering, with many new concepts (even if they bear traditional names). We will have to wait for the appearance of Maudlin's follow-up book to see the fitness of this framework in action.