New Interpretations of Berkeley's Thought

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Stephen H. Daniel (ed.), New Interpretations of Berkeley's Thought, Humanity Books, 2008, 319pp., $80.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781591025573.

Reviewed by Marc A. Hight, Hampden-Sydney College


An international conference concerning the philosophy of the Irish immaterialist George Berkeley was held in 2003, drawing many of the most pre-eminent Berkeley scholars from Europe and the United States. Along with a companion collection of essays simultaneously published by the University of Toronto Press entitled Reexamining Berkeley's Thought, many of those papers now appear in print, twelve of them in the present volume.

The title is, to be honest, a bit misleading. Most of the papers in the volume do not constitute 'new interpretations' of Berkeley. Several of them engage or extend long-standing debates in the scholarly literature while a few others are historical pieces not properly designed to introduce 'interpretations' in this sense at all. Fortunately, the odd title is perhaps the worst of the flaws of the book, which is to say that the collection nonetheless contains a number of excellent and occasionally provocative articles that any serious early modern scholar will want to own. As is typical of anthologies, the articles are varied in quality, although I think it fair to say that the overall quality is more even than in most books of this nature. In what follows for the rest of this review I provide an overview of the articles along with occasional critical engagements of select parts of them.

The opening article by Charles McCracken entitled "Berkeley's Realism" discusses the senses in which one might call Berkeley a realist, although the paper rapidly focuses on narrower disputes, especially an important one about whether the ideas perceived by finite minds are or may be numerically identical to ideas perceived by God. McCracken suggests that

Berkeley held that things exist whether we perceive them or not, but in different ways; as perceived by us, they exist as sensations; as unperceived, they exist in the sense that God decrees what sensations we would have were we in certain states, which requires that God have ideas of what he is decreeing, but not that those ideas be identical to the sensations he decrees we will have. (36)

The suggestion is interesting, but seems to be subject to a rather serious objection, namely that such a view introduces a pernicious form of skepticism into Berkeley's system. If the sensations we as finite minds perceive are numerically distinct from the order of nature as decreed and preserved by God, then one may rightly question how we could know that the ideas we perceive are in fact accurate representations of God's. To be fair to McCracken, he covers a lot of ground in the essay and cannot reasonably anticipate every objection, but this particular concern is a prime motivation for those scholars who wish to read Berkeley as more of a realist than others.

The second essay by Daniel Flage ("Berkeley's Epistemic Ontology: The Three Dialogues") extends an interpretative line that Flage has been advancing for several years.[1] His claim is that the esse is percipi principle is "an epistemological principle of ontological commitment" (46). In rough, Flage argues that Berkeley has been wrongly read as a metaphysician who extended his analysis to epistemic issues when in fact that description has the cart before the horse. It is epistemic issues like the nature of perception and the threat of skepticism that push Berkeley to immaterialism. He ultimately concludes that the defense of immaterialism in Three Dialogues (3D) rests on epistemic principles (as well as issues of theoretical simplicity). In general the account is well balanced and his thesis is plausible. At times, however, I worry that Flage allows his thesis to drive his readings of the text. He argues that the third dialogue extends the epistemic argument by allegedly showing that immaterialism has fewer skeptical consequences than materialism and that immaterialism can also answer certain skeptical challenges materialism cannot. In his treatment of the 'same house' passage from 3D 247, Flage defends his epistemic reading of the argument of Three Dialogues with a particular reading of the passage. When the materialist Hylas challenges Philonous (the spokesman for Berkeley) to explain the apparent consequence of immaterialism that no two people can see the same thing, Flage characterizes Philonous's response as follows: "Two people see the same qualitatively and temporally complex thing by perceiving distinct ideas which are components of that thing" (67). This reading allows Flage to argue that Berkeley is applying a parity of reasoning move here, such that materialists suffer from the exact same problem -- and this is consistent with his assertion that epistemic concerns are doing all the work. Yet there is reason to think that Flage's gloss on the 3D 247 passage is misleading. When confronted with the question as to whether two persons might perceive the numerically same idea, Philonous actually says

But if the term same be used in the acceptation of philosophers, who pretend to an abstracted notion of [numerical] identity, then, according to their sundry definitions of this notion, it may or may not be possible for diverse persons to perceive the same thing. (3D 247)

When Berkeley suggests that it "may or may not be possible" for two persons to perceive the numerically same idea, that suggests that more ontological concerns are guiding his thinking. There is not the space to engage the issue fully here, but I only want to suggest that there remains room to engage Flage's otherwise smart thesis.

Martha Bolton presents an interesting hypothesis about the relationship between Berkeley and Locke on abstraction. In "Berkeley and Mental Representation: Why Not a Lockean Theory of Ideas?" she argues that Berkeley engages Locke only after assuming a theory of the nature of ideas that is distinct from the one Locke actually holds. Berkeley's sensory ideas have their representational nature removed; at least many of them are non-intentional. It is not always clear how this separates Berkeley from Locke, since Berkeley clearly does indicate that non-simple ideas can or do represent: they represent other ideas. Although that is not a representation of a mind-independent reality, it is nonetheless arguably a form of intentional representation. And one might argue that Lockean simple ideas are also non-intentional, just as with Berkeley's proper objects. To the extent, however, that one is not inclined to read Berkeley as a realist, her thesis gains more strength. Interestingly, at the end of the essay she suggests that Berkeley in fact has some legitimate grounds for believing that Locke's basic conception of an idea is flawed, thus justifying his unstated assumption of a different conception of ideas. Bolton suggests that Berkeley might have believed that Locke's theory of ideas requires an illicit appeal to innatist non-sensory sources. This suggestion is intriguing and I think justifies further elaboration than she has room for in this paper.

In the fourth paper, "The Objects of Immediate Perception", Margaret Atherton challenges the claim made by George Pappas in Berkeley's Thought that common sense objects are, qua physical objects, immediately perceived. Instead, she argues that there is an inferential element to the perception of objects (which are collections of ideas) even though individual ideas are immediately perceived. Her case for the claim that physical objects are only mediately perceived is well-argued and, to my mind, right. Advocates of the Pappas view will want to have recourse to this paper in the future.

The next paper, "Strong and Weak Heterogeneity in Berkeley's New Theory of Vision" by Robert Muehlmann, advances a controversial thesis about Berkeley's assertion that we do not see what we feel. Muehlmann distinguishes between two theses in the New Theory. Weak heterogeneity is the claim that the objects of the various senses are numerically distinct. Strong heterogeneity is the additional claim that those objects also do not share any sensible quality in common (123, 124). Using this distinction, Muehlmann argues that strong heterogeneity undermines the act/object distinction in perception (125). The thesis is controversial in part because Muehlmann readily admits that "there is no direct argument for the denial of the act-object distinction in the Principles" (141). His goal is to establish that there is an implicit argument for this denial in the New Theory. Using the strong-weak distinction, he claims that weak heterogeneity is compatible with the supposition that there is a quality that we both see and touch, allowing for modally distinct perceptions of the one quality. That move is similarly hard to accept, however, since Berkeley explicitly conflates ideas and qualities (qualities just are ideas). Thus, to claim (as Muehlmann does) that weak heterogeneity allows for modally distinct perceptions of one quality is tantamount to saying that we can have modally distinct perceptions of one idea -- which is explicitly denied even by the weak version of heterogeneity. These initial concerns aside, his argument for his main conclusion deserves more careful analysis than I can provide in this review.

The middle essay in the volume is Jeffrey Barnouw's article "The Two Motives Behind Berkeley's Expressly Unmotivated Signs: Sure Perception and Personal Providence." Barnouw's thesis is that Berkeley uses a theory of signs where the connections between signs and things signified are arbitrary. The thesis is not new and Barnouw does not advance any particular philosophical thesis about Berkeley's theory of signs, but the presentation and organization of the material is quite nice and will be useful as a resource to those interested in doing further work on Berkeley's theory of signs.

In the seventh essay, Talia Mae Bettcher explores Berkeley's theory of mind. "Berkeley on Self-Consciousness" argues that Berkeley employs a new model of consciousness distinct from that of his Cartesian and Lockean predecessors. According to Bettcher, Berkeley has a "bifurcated" model of consciousness, where there is a consciousness of ideas (as distinct from the self, since ideas are not modes of the mind) and a consciousness of self (191). Unfortunately it is not quite clear exactly what this entails in terms of the underlying metaphysics. For instance, it is not entirely clear what it is that is bifurcated. It cannot be the mind itself, since spiritual substance is unitary according to Berkeley. As Bettcher herself sagely notes (196), the interpretation still has puzzles to solve, especially those concerning the relationship between the mind and its ideas. In particular, the nature of mental operations (including, presumably, those involved in consciousness itself) remain unclear. Bettcher thus provides an intriguing starting suggestion about Berkeley's theory of mind that will hopefully point to further developments in the future.

The eighth essay is by Stephen Daniel and is entitled "Berkeley's Stoic Notion of Spiritual Substance." The thesis of the essay is that Berkeley employed a Stoic and hence non-traditional conception of substance. Although scholarly and smartly written, I have reservations about the thesis and the arguments used to support it. Daniel reflectively employs several methodological tenets that motivate his reading of Berkeley. For example, he tells us in one footnote (n. 23, 227) that he thinks of the Notebook entries as consistent -- presumably in toto -- with all of his published works. I believe there are other methodological assumptions at work as well, although I am not always able to identify them. Part of my suspicion here is due to the fact that Daniel reads some passages in ways that are otherwise unusual. Early in his piece Daniel asserts that "Berkeley explicitly denies that minds or spiritual substances are such ideas" and that, as a result, "to claim, therefore, that spirits exist or are beings or are even things at all is, for Berkeley, to misunderstand the nature of mind" (203). He draws this conclusion on the basis of Principles of Human Knowledge, which reads:

Spirits and ideas are things so wholly different, that when we say, they exist, they are known, or the like, these words must not be thought to signify anything common to both natures. There is nothing alike or common in them. (142)

I find it difficult to accept that saying "spirits and ideas are things so wholly different" -- which at least superficially seems to indicate that both are things -- implies that spirits are not beings or things. Daniel builds his case by providing an interpretative account (based in part on previous work of his that shows that there are Stoic and Ramist influences on Berkeley[2]) of substance that reveals it to be not a traditional substance which is an independent and enduring thing, but a subsisting expression of the differentiation and identity of ideas (see 214 and especially 217). One worry about this view is that Daniel employs an understanding of 'subsists' that is difficult to grasp. Typically to say that x subsists is to say that x exists as a substance, but this is clearly not what Daniel has in mind. Instead, he says "whenever Berkeley uses the word subsist, it is always to emphasize the fact that, apart from the activity of mind, no thing can exist" (207). The evidence he provides for this assertion, however, is seriously unclear. He cites the many examples where Berkeley uses the term, but none of those seem to preclude a more traditional understanding of the term. Furthermore, if we are right that Berkeley was born in 1685 and matriculated at Trinity College Dublin in 1700 at the age of 15, it follows that most of Berkeley's key education occurred in an environment where Locke and Descartes were the core texts. Molyneux writes to Locke before the turn of the 18th century to inform him that his text is already required reading at Trinity. Locke clearly uses the term 'subsist' to mean either existence in the nature of substance or existence in a substance (see Essay Concerning Human Understanding II.1.12 and II.23.1). Even had Berkeley been exposed to Stoic influences, given the primacy of Cartesian and Lockean texts in his education at Trinity, it is unlikely that Berkeley would use senses of the terms alien to his contemporary audience. So far as I know, we have no evidence that Archbishop King, Peter Browne, or other signal persons in Dublin at the time embraced Stoic teachings, especially given the association of Stoic thought with determinism and materialism. These criticisms aside, I must confess that the Daniel reading has a certain internal logic that gives it a compelling flavor. His provocative and smart analysis will -- and should -- continue to engage scholars.

The volume continues on with Geneviève Brykman's exploration of freedom in her essay "On Human Liberty in Berkeley's Alciphron VII." Her piece provides a comprehensive overview of the claims Berkeley makes about human freedom and how the issue interfaces with other prominent topics in his philosophical system. As a result of her analysis of how he thinks about human freedom, Brykman ably concludes that Berkeley wants a conception of freedom that is consistent with how he understands the essential activity of the mind. According to Brykman, Berkeley faults materialists for making the mind too passive, which in turn results in determinism, fatalism, and even atheism.

The tenth essay by Douglas Jesseph, called "Faith and Fluxions: Berkeley on Theology and Mathematics," extends his previous work on Berkeley's philosophy of mathematics. Jesseph rightly notes and explains how Berkeley produces an argument for why mathematics is subject to a more stringent epistemological standard than theology -- and why this should be expected even for committed theists. The discussion outlines the differences between mathematics and theology in a clear manner that will be useful for those engaged in Berkeley's scientific thinking.

Timo Airaksinen authors the penultimate essay, whose topic is Berkeley's late work Siris. In "The Path of Fire: The Meaning and Interpretation of Berkeley's Siris," Airaksinen walks the reader through various stages of the work. The essay is an extension of his earlier work (see n. 1, 279) and does not present any arguments or new conclusions about the work, although it is filled with important and interesting historical information relevant to understanding both Berkeley and his claims in Siris. The piece is thus mostly of historical interest, although I can recommend it also if for no other reason than its dry humorous style. Airaksinen concludes his piece summarizing what he takes the meaning of the work to be, recounting the sense in which the world may be cognized as a chain that emphasizes the presence of God and how our place in the world depends on God's words as causal agents that sustain us. And then he concludes the essay with a wry twist: "Tar is the key example of a nourishing substance in Siris. God said, let there be tar, and tar was seen to be good" (279).

The final essay is an excellent historical piece about the reception of Berkeley's ideas in France. Sébastien Charles recounts in "Berkeley and the Lumières: Misconception and Reconstruction," how, despite explicitly arguing otherwise, Berkeley became known as a symbol of skepticism and even atheism in France. Because his works were initially reviewed in French publications by what can only be styled as careless readers, they were seriously misrepresented. Even after French language editions of Berkeley's core texts were eventually made available, it was not until after the end of the 18th century that the continent began to properly understand the Irish thinker. Charles's account is clear and scholarly, a useful aid especially for those interested in early modern history of ideas.

As a whole the volume is quite respectable. Even where I have critical reservations about some of the arguments I judge that the pieces are worthy of careful analysis and several of them will remain useful resources for Berkeley scholars. An anthology that does not provoke at least some critical engagement or provide important scholarly resources is unlikely to be worth acquiring. This book easily passes that test on both scores.

[1] See, for example, Flage, "Berkeley's Epistemic Ontology: The Principles," Canadian Journal of Philosophy 34 (2004): 25-60.

[2] See, for example, Daniel, "Edwards, Berkeley and Ramist Logic," Idealistic Studies 31 (2001): 55-72 and Daniel, "Berkeley, Suárez, and the Esse-Existere Distinction," American Catholic Philosophical Quarterly 74 (2000): 621-36.