New Issues in Epistemological Disjunctivism

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Casey Doyle, Joseph Milburn, Duncan Pritchard (eds.), New Issues in Epistemological Disjunctivism, Routledge, 2019, 396pp., $150.00, ISBN 9781138094093.

Reviewed by Kegan J. Shaw, Anderson University (SC)


Epistemological disjunctivism is a theory of perceptual knowledge -- or least it is usually advanced and discussed in connection with perceptual knowledge. While there isn't one way of stating the view simply, it's safe to say that if it's true then perceptual knowledge can enjoy rational grounds that are both factive and reflectively accessible to the subject. (cf. Pritchard 2012). This book is the first volume dedicated exclusively to investigation of this idea. Here Casey Doyle, Joe Millburn, and Duncan Pritchard have collected seventeen very nice essays that, in my view, not only reflect well the cutting edge but also serve to advance the discussion in interesting and productive directions.

The volume will certainly be of interest to those doing research in the philosophy of perception: especially the epistemology of perception. Those who have an interest in the Stoics, Kant, Wittgenstein, or Austin, especially as their thought relates to perception, will find essays here worth reading through. The volume will also be of interest to those working in the epistemology of memory, other minds, self-knowledge, and testimony.

The volume contains two new essays by John McDowell and Pritchard -- arguably the two most important expositors of epistemological disjunctivism. The remaining essays are organized into three groups, those devoted to: (1) exploring the historical precursors of epistemological disjunctivism; (2) exposing and tackling new problems for it; and (3) weighing the prospects of extending epistemological disjunctivism to understand knowledge in other (non-perceptual) domains. Below I offer concise summaries of each essay in the order that they appear, highlighting key points of interest, while targeting a few for extended commentary.

McDowell is widely recognized to be the progenitor of epistemological disjunctivism. He has long defended the thought that one can know that p on the rational basis of one's seeing that p to be the case. In his contribution McDowell gives fresh expression to this idea. Here he is particularly clear on the point that the kind of rationally grounded perceptual knowledge that he targets is not properly conceived as the result of a cooperative effort between two distinct capacities for knowledge: one fallible, resulting in perceptual knowledge when things go well; the other infallible, facilitating reflective access to relevant rational grounds for that knowledge. Rather, crucially, all of this is an act of one and the same fallible capacity for perceptual knowledge. In McDowell's own words: "knowledge of one's ground for a perceptually knowledgeable judgment is an act of the same capacity for knowledge that is in act in the perceptual knowledge constituted by the judgment " (p. 37).

It's worth highlighting how this engages what is usually the critic's very first objection to epistemological disjunctivism (this is my framing of the objection, not McDowell's). The thought goes that no subject can really ever be sure that she sees that something is so -- no subject can ever really be sure that she isn't suffering some one-off hallucination, for example. Surely then, the thought continues, one doesn't have relevant reflective access to the fact that one sees that something is so.

Now suppose "being sure" here is an epistemic notion. In particular suppose being sure that one sees that p is thought to rule out what McDowell says is "the familiar fact that someone can, without carelessness or inattention, take oneself to be perceiving that things are a certain way in her environment when she is not" (p. 35). In that case McDowell can entirely agree with the critic's observation but will quickly remark that it only follows that one's capacity to learn through experience that one sees that p is fallible -- something McDowell's view already takes in stride. To think it further follows that, even in paradigmatic cases, one cannot have the relevant kind of access to the fact that one sees that p requires an assumption to the effect that such access could be facilitated only by an infallible capacity. But this assumption requires argument and is in any case false if McDowell's take on things is correct. McDowell might contend, then, that one can be sure enough that one sees that p even if one cannot be sure in the sense that he thinks is entirely unrealistic to the human condition.

After McDowell, Pritchard is next most well-known for defending epistemological disjunctivism. But he is also well known for defending a more general theory of knowledge that he calls anti-luck virtue epistemology. In his contribution Pritchard focuses attention on describing the relationship between these two views. Far from being incompatible, Pritchard argues that the two views make for a natural pairing. To this end he makes two important observations: First, that anti-luck virtue epistemology makes no demands on knowledge generally that aren't satisfied by what epistemological disjunctivism requires of perceptual knowledge in particular; and second that, at least where intellectual virtue is concerned, epistemological disjunctivism makes no demands on perceptual knowledge in particular that go beyond the demands that anti-luck virtue epistemology makes of knowledge generally. Pritchard's discussion here is especially relevant for anyone tempted to think that epistemological disjunctivism requires a subject to perform unrealistic amounts of epistemic work for sustaining perceptual knowledge.

Iakovos Vasiliou presents a compelling case for thinking that ancient Stoic philosophers very likely defended a form of epistemological disjunctivism, or at least something teasingly close. He does a careful job of highlighting important similarities between the Stoic conception of a cataleptic appearance and McDowell's conception of a perceptual experience. In the end the reader is left with the strong impression that the Stoics very likely thought of perceptual knowledge in much the same way as do present day epistemological disjunctivists.

Thomas Lockhart illuminates important connections between McDowell's epistemological disjunctivism and McDowell's interpretation of Kant's notion of an empirical intuition. This involves his drawing out how McDowell leans heavily on the Kantian notion for giving clear expression to the thought that perceptual experiences can themselves put one in position to acquire rationally grounded perceptual knowledge despite their having the same content as that involved in an introspectively indistinguishable hallucination. As Lockhart makes clear, McDowell's solution is to conceive of both experiences as involving contents that "draw upon the same conceptual capacities" (p. 107) -- only nondefectively in the "good case", where this is a matter of the target experience putting a subject in position to form rationally grounded perceptual knowledge on its basis.

One worry is that, on this view, it follows that the way in which a given experience represents its content depends upon circumstances beyond one's local environment. At least that seems to follow if we think that one cannot enjoy rationally grounded knowledge in fake barn cases. For in that case, even when looking squarely at a barn, McDowell's view commits us to saying that the way that the barn is visually represented in fake barn country is different than the way it is represented if you simply replace the surrounding fake barns with real ones. I can imagine that that will strike many as a strange result. In any case, that is to register a potential problem with McDowell's view, not Lockhart's exposition of McDowell's view in relationship to Kant, which I found to be excellent.

Genia Schönbaumsfeld aims to establish that Wittgenstein adopts a form of epistemological disjunctivism. Ultimately, she rests her case on a series of remarks from On Certainty that she takes to provide sufficient evidence for thinking that Wittgenstein rejects "The Reasons Identity Thesis": the thought that in both the good case and the bad case, our perceptual reasons are the same" (p. 113). While there is much of interest in Schönbaumsfeld's discussion, in the end I think that this is insufficient grounds for concluding, as she does, that "Wittgenstein . . . was one of the first proponents of a disjunctivist view" (p. 114).

Even if Schönbaumsfeld is right that Wittgenstein rejects the thought that, in the good case, one's perceptual knowledge enjoys no more rational support than in the bad case, nothing positive strictly follows about the nature of perceptual knowledge. In particular, nothing strictly follows about whether such knowledge enjoys factive rational support. Schönbaumsfeld's drawing this inference is most likely a symptom of her adopting an overly lenient conception of epistemological disjunctivism, requiring only that "perceptual knowledge is possible -- that is to say, that if we are in the good case perception will apprise us of the facts" (p. 113). But clearly perception can apprise one of the facts even if not by furnishing one with factive rational support, as many would suppose is required of any disjunctivist view worth the label.

Guy Longworth uncovers interesting ties between metaphysical disjunctivism and J.L. Austin's thought. In particular Longworth does a fine job of revealing how Austin's thinking on perception paves the way for contemporary defenses/expressions of metaphysical disjunctivism, even if Austin himself didn't clearly defend any such view. While there is much of great value in his contribution, it may be worth noting that Longworth makes no attempt to connect the discussion to epistemological disjunctivism. The omission is a bit surprising given the book's titular focus, but more importantly because of Austin's commitment to the "silence of the senses": a commitment that seems inhospitable to a McDowellian epistemological disjunctivism that would require perceptual experience to have content in order to rationally ground perceptual judgments. However, this should not distract from the fact that Longworth offers, in my view, an excellent discussion of the bearings of Austin's thought on metaphysical disjunctivism.

Sonia Sedivy highlights, among other things, the advantages of McDowell's view over competing "purely relational" views of perception. The real value in her discussion, however, emerges towards the end where she presents the outlines of a case for thinking, pace McDowell, that experience draws upon our capacities for sorting objects into natural and nonnatural kinds since experiences can have aesthetic content.

As Sedivy's article exemplifies, orthodox versions of epistemological disjunctivism are committed to the idea that perceptual experience has representational content. Craig French notices that this clearly commits orthodox versions of epistemological disjunctivism to contentious theses in the metaphysics of perception. This is not an ideal situation, French observes, not least because it seems to render epistemological disjunctivism inaccessible to those who doubt representationalism. In this connection French sees tremendous advantage in defending what he calls the "thing seeing" approach according to which seeing a crow can rationally legitimate believing that something is a crow just as much as seeing that something is a crow can. The bulk of French's essay is taken up with a stimulating defense of the notion that perceptual experience can rationalize perceptually based beliefs despite lacking representational content -- so long as we can still appeal to its "conscious character".

Even if one sides with French on this issue, it remains natural to think that a perceptual experience can afford one rational support of a fundamentally different kind than that provided by an introspectively indiscernible hallucination only if the former experience is of a fundamentally different kind than the latter. epistemological disjunctivism thus seems naturally allied to metaphysical disjunctivism. Veli Mitova argues that this is bad news not least because the alliance would seem to entail that motivating reasons for perceptual belief too easily "shape-shift" under conditions in which one's experience shifts undetectably between a seeing of an object and a mere seeming seeing.

Clayton Littlejohn is not at all convinced that McDowell's brand of epistemological disjunctivism has any real advantage over a knowledge-first approach that combines a knowledge norm for belief with E=K. In his contribution entitled "Neither/Nor" he contends that "neither [epistemological disjunctivism] not a suitably matched metaphysical disjunctivism is necessary for accounting for the justification of perceptual belief" (p. 235). In support of this claim Littlejohn aims to show that epistemological disjunctivism is neither "tenable" nor "well motivated": untenable since Littlejohn knows of no plausible conception of perceptual experience that can underwrite possession of factive reasons; unmotivated because he knows of no good reason for thinking that perceptual justification requires motivating reasons in the first place.

Ram Neta observes that epistemological disjunctivism can seem in tension with intuitive judgments about how confident one should be in beliefs that are apparently well-supported by visual experiences. In particular it can seem obvious that, whether a subject is in the "good case" or the corresponding "bad case", this should have zero impact upon how confident one should be that a given perceptual belief is true. But this can seem mysterious on epistemological disjunctivism, given how much better one's rational support is in the good case.

Neta offers a defense of epistemological disjunctivism in light of this problem that, true to form, is both highly rigorous and instructive. Crucial to Neta's defense is the thought that, even if one has factive rational support in the good case, one might be rationally less confident of having this rational support than one is of having the non-factive rational support in the bad case for accepting the same belief. But then, if, as Neta proposes, we should think that evidential support is a function not only of the evidence one has but also how confident one should be that one has this evidence, there may be room for maintaining that although one's evidence in the good case is much better than the evidence one has in the corresponding bad case, still the total support that this evidence lends to one's perceptual belief is the same in either case.

Adrian Haddock's contribution is unique insofar as it's primarily focused on metaepistemological issues. His principle aim is to set epistemological disjunctivism against a background that helps to reveal more clearly the sense in which it contains a real anti-skeptical insight. Along the way Haddock offers a rich metaepistemological analysis of the underlying motivations that tend to make epistemological internalists out of some folks and epistemological externalists out of others: where ultimately this boils down to a decision about whether to abandon concern for a conception of knowledge that entails "the capacity to express a thought in a manner that reveals it to be true" (p. 269).

Millburn and Andrew Moon test whether there is a viable disjunctivist conception of memory knowledge. They find that there is, but only for what they call "experiential memory knowledge": that which is sustained through the kind of conscious recalling of a past event involving relevant kinds of imagery. By contrast, they find that most kinds of "stored memory knowledge" don't fare as well because, for example, one can retain knowledge that snow is white while asleep, and so without seeming to have reflective access to anything that might provide factive rational support.

But I wonder about this. Millburn and Moon highlight that, while asleep, there isn't any conscious state of remembering snow to be white that might serve as one's factive rational support for this belief. Nor, they say, should we appeal to one's implicitly remembering that snow is white since, on their view, this entails believing that snow is white, making it impossible to serve as the rational basis for one's belief. But why not appeal to an implicit factive state of remembering snow to be white? It would seem to me that, not only doesn't this state entail belief that snow is white, but it's also reflectively accessible in the following sense: that even while asleep it is true of the subject that she need acquire no additional information in order to know that she remembers snow being white. If something like that is plausible, then I'm not sure that what Moon and Millburn call noninferential stored memory knowledge cannot be given a disjunctivist treatment, contrary to what the authors suggest.

Stephen Wright weighs whether McDowell is right to think that knowledge from testimony might enjoy reflectively accessible factive rational support. He presents McDowell's testimonial disjunctivism as a via media between classic reductionist and anti-reductionist views in the epistemology of testimony, partly to demonstrate how testimonial disjunctivism can slip between some standard objections to the latter views.

Dorit Bar-On and Drew Johnson offer a compelling case not only for conceiving of self-knowledge along disjunctivist lines, but for thinking that actually this is the most defensible version of epistemological disjunctivism owing to its immunity to problems arising in connection with metaphysical disjunctivism. The pair defend a version of neo-expressivism according to which self-knowledge is rationally grounded in the very mental states that the target self-knowledge concerns.

Doyle picks up on this general theme. It can be tempting to think that epistemological disjunctivism about self-knowledge is more defensible than epistemological disjunctivism about perceptual knowledge, since the latter view but not the former has the relevant knowledge grounded on appearances, making it susceptible to what Pritchard has called the distinguishability problem. Doyle argues that since there are "ringers for belief", disjunctivist treatments of doxastic self-knowledge are susceptible to their own version of the distinguishability problem.

Finally, Anita Avramides offers what to my mind is an exceptionally clear accounting of the relationship between McDowell's epistemological disjunctivism about perception and his epistemological disjunctivism about other minds. She presents the two views as the natural outworking of McDowell's fundamental resistance to a Cartesian conception of mind that allows room for the familiar spate of radical skeptical arguments to gain purchase. Avramides does a wonderful job of highlighting how resistance to this Cartesian picture would motivate someone like McDowell to advance a form of metaphysical disjunctivism entailing not only the availability in experience of external world objects, but also something quite close to the availability in experience of other's mental states. This article will be of interest not only to those working in the epistemology of other minds, but also those concerned to better understand the big picture behind McDowell's epistemology.