New Philosophies of Film: Thinking Images

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Robert Sinnerbrink, New Philosophies of Film: Thinking Images, Continuum, 2011, 247 pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781441153432.

Reviewed by Jason M. Wirth, Seattle University


At least in the eyes of the lineage of interpretations constituted or inspired by Platonism, art has not fared well as an intellectually serious enterprise that can make discoveries unique to its media. When Plato in the culminating tenth book of The Republic banished the tragic poets beyond the walls of the polis, philosophy asserted the privilege of the concept over the image. Ideas are clear and distinct, while images lack such lucidity. When images are interpreted, they are reduced to their underlying intellectual content, as if images, to the extent that they are meaningful, are mere illustrations and exemplifications of ideas. Even Hegel in announcing the end of art knew that the Idea was more complete than art's heritage of merely sensuous absolutes. This demotion of the image did not diminish with the advent of the moving image. Despite the work of certain auteurs whose works were clearly intellectually challenging and original, most philosophers ignored film altogether, implying that it was not worth thinking seriously about. Film was just another episode in the philosophical disenfranchisement of art.

Happily this situation has begun to change for the better over the last four decades or so as a body of philosophical work has begun to accumulate around the provocation of cinema. Sinnerbrink enters the fray as a critical narrator of the history of this burgeoning philosophical enterprise as well as a participant in it and, in my judgment, makes an important contribution on both accounts.

His book can therefore be read along these two trajectories. On the one hand, it is a helpful primer of the recent history of philosophy's new relationship to cinema. His narration begins with philosophy's early obliviousness to film. "Among the great modern thinkers film barely rates a mention" (1). Sinnerbrink then turns to the rise of what later analytic theoreticians disparaged as Grand Theory, in which overarching paradigms like Marxism or psychoanalysis appear to be applied willy-nilly to any film being analyzed. If you were a psychoanalyst, for example, you saw all films as a play of unconscious drives. The rise of what Sinnerbrink characterizes as the naturalism and common sense approach of the "analytic-cognitivist" paradigm, embodied by important thinkers like David Bordwell, Noël Carroll, Richard Allen, and Murray Smith, brought a much needed sobering and deflationary approach to the reigning grandiosity of film theory. It calls them out for their "medium essentialism" (there is one thing only that is fundamentally at stake in film), for conflating film theory with film criticism (18), and, most importantly, for committing the "fallacy of exemplification" (18), that is, "proving the claims of a theory via selective film interpretation (18). If you are a Marxist, for example, every film inadvertently partakes in the class struggle and, in so doing, offers further evidence of the universal validity of Marxist theory. The analytic-cognitivist approach offers some valuable escape routes from such traps and, in any case, if one does not find some way to break the hold of this circle, films lose their ability to surprise us and teach us.

On the other hand, it is already at this point that we can appreciate the book's second valence, namely, its defense of the autonomy of the moving image, that is, that complex constructions of images (films) have an irreduciblely aesthetic value that is independent of the dominion of the concept. While we can be thankful that the deflationary interventions of the analytic-cognitivist approach expose the danger of dogmatism lurking in Grand Theory, they risk being too reductionist. The appeal to common sense and naturalism, for example, assumes, unlike either Marxism or psychoanalysis, that "human subjects are rational masters of their conscious experience" (18). Is the natural attitude ever as natural as it asserts itself to be? Can reason ever claim to have fully emancipated itself from the subterranean influences of ideology and other unconscious forces? (This was the strength, despite its lopsided and heavy-handed approach, of Grand Theory. Yes, there is no one thing that film is, no "medium essentialism", but this does not mean that film cannot also be studied from perspectives like critical theory and psychoanalysis. Analyzing a film from these kinds of perspectives does not have to imply that this is the only or even the best way to approach a film, only that it, like all of the other approaches that Sinnerbrink discusses, makes it own kind of revelations.)

Most importantly, unlike Gilles Deleuze and Stanley Cavell (the two thinkers at the heart of this study), those using analytic-cognitivist approaches have little to say about

why film matters to us more generally. What is at stake in our aesthetic engagement with film? Is film just a clever cognitivist puzzle to amuse a distracted public? Do films respond to our cultural anxieties and 'existential' concerns? Can cinema deal with problems such as nihilism and skepticism? (90)

Deflation can be a welcome antidote both to dogmatism and speculative grandiosity, but it threatens to give little to say about the larger stakes of cinematic art. Some arenas of contemporary philosophical activity have long been somewhat reticent about talking about the historically big questions in philosophy, but the films that Sinnerbrink asks us to consider (David Lynch's INLAND EMPIRE, Lars von Trier's Antichrist, and Terrence Malick's The New World) are artistically audacious films. Each of these films, in its own way, addresses large, high stake human problems in surprising and sometimes shockingly unfamiliar ways. Not only are they about questions that matter, they strive to show that cinema really matters, that it can be a unique and valuable medium in which to raise these kinds of questions.

This brings us to Sinnerbrink 's most critical concern, reclamation of the power of a specifically artistic mode of thinking that is not simply philosophy by other means and which does not cede everything to practices of philosophy and give philosophy the first and last word on cinema. Sinnerbrink attempts to defend the autonomy of art against the "Platonic prejudice against art," a demotion that Arthur Danto felicitously dubbed "the philosophical disenfranchisement of art." This is a philosophical prejudice that assumes the superiority of its own voice and seeks to "to subsume works of art into a philosophical discourse that enables us to master, comprehend and subordinate the work to theoretical and moral concerns" (4-5). This is philosophy's self-serving account of its rivalry with the poets and it manifests

philosophy's inveterate tendency to subordinate art as an inferior way of knowing, one that is theoretically completed by philosophy proper. In the difficult marriage between philosophy and film, "philosophy wears the trousers" (to use J. L. Austin's rather off-color phrase), deciding the terms of engagement and judging the worthiness of its cinematic partner in the mirror of philosophy's own standards. (128)

In his reclamation of the dignity of art as possessing its own modes of thinking, Sinnerbrink distinguishes the various forms of philosophy of film from what he calls film-philosophy. The former includes the early attempts at Grand Theory, the analytic-cognitivist accounts of film, as well as the more recent work of philosophers like Thomas Wartenberg, Stephen Mulhall, and Daniel Frampton who argue about the various ways in which cinema can be understood as a certain kind of philosophy. While the philosophy as film arguments are quite intriguing, and while they provocatively invite us to reconsider what "counts" as philosophy (135), film-philosophy, strives to think with film in "more aesthetically receptive ways" (9). It does not automatically assume that it will encounter film as either a lesser form of thinking (philosophy explains what film merely shows) or philosophy by other means (arguments in cinematic terms). The challenge is as clear as it is formidable: "Can we avoid the trap of philosophical allegory that seems to beckon as soon as image meets concept?" (194).

Sinnerbrink asks us to move beyond the ancient divorce of idea and image. He also asks us to move beyond a new, unhappy marriage between idea and image, a "hierarchical relationship" (117) between philosophy and film. This unhappy marriage, as in Ingmar Bergman's Scenes from a Marriage (1973), remains "calm, orderly, and secure, provided that one partner dominates the epistemic agenda or sets the terms of (interpretive) engagement for the other. Hardly a recipe for marital bliss!" (135).

Film-philosophy approaches a thoughtful film in a manner that respects what Milan Kundera once said about his practice of writing a novel. An author who writes books with titles like The Unbearable Lightness of Being obviously seems marked by what we typically consider philosophical themes (in this case, Heidegger's question of the meaning of being) and indeed Kundera is unequivocal about his commitment to the novel as a medium of thought. When directly asked, however, if he is a philosophical novelist, perhaps a phenomenologist or some other kind of philosopher who engages in writing philosophy in the form of a novel, he is defiant. Responding in a formula that he borrowed from the philosopher-become-novelist Hermann Broch, Kundera insists that a "novel does what only a novel can do." Responding to Christian Salmon's suggestion that his novels are "phenomenological," Kundera responded:

The adjective isn't bad, but I make it a rule not to use it. I'm too fearful of the professors for whom art is only a derivative of philosophical and theoretical trends. The novel dealt with the unconscious before Freud, the class struggle before Marx, it practiced phenomenology (the investigation of the essence of human situations) before the phenomenologists. What superb "phenomenological descriptions" in Proust, who never even knew a phenomenologist! [Kundera, The Art of the Novel, trans. Linda Asher (New York: Grove Press, 1988), 32].

For Kundera, Broch (as well as Robert Musil) "brought a sovereign and radiant intelligence to bear on the novel," but this does not mean that the goal is "to transform the novel into philosophy, but to marshal around the story all the means -- rational and irrational, narrative and contemplative -- that could illuminate man's being; could make of the novel the supreme intellectual synthesis" (Kundera, 16). The philosophical disenfranchisement of art is such a deeply entrenched philosophical habit that it seems like we are being generous to insist that film or the novel could be genuinely philosophical. It seems utterly outlandish to argue that it is possible that certain artworks strive to be in some ways more thoughtful than philosophy! This is nonetheless how things are fated to appear when philosophy monopolizes the practice of serious thinking. The only way to free enough space for a philosophical encounter with art requires that we reconsider the terms of its unhappy marriage with art. A philosophical artwork does not just illustrate philosophical ideas. This would make film-analysis an ongoing case of reverse translation as we returned the artistic presentation of ideas to their original conceptual forms.

It is not therefore clear to someone like Kundera why some of the most purportedly philosophical novels (works by existentialists like Sartre or Camus or the political allegories of George Orwell) are novels at all. If Animal Farm is a political treatise by other means, why not just cut out the middleman and write a political treatise about the dangers of totalitarianism? Novels are not stealth philosophical brochures. What kinds of truth and what manners of discovery are unique to the novel? What can only the novel do? What can only a film do? The Norwegian poet Rolf Jacobsen made the same point about his poetry. "A poem is not a poem if you can say it better with prose." [Rolf Jacobsen, Night Open, trans. Olav Grinde (Fredonia, New York: White Pine Press, 1993), 216]. The poem strives with the powers particular to its own enterprise to express "what no one has been able to express before" and "to make visible what has been invisible" (Jacobsen, 217).

One can see this problem in films that are too explicitly philosophical. Films that are only incidentally films but whose raison d'être is the presentation of their philosophical ideas have the same charm as a philosophy lecture. On the other hand, documentaries like Astra Taylor's Zizek! (2005) or Examined Life (2008), have a value that is not exclusively philosophical. On the other hand, films by auteurs like Fellini, Malick, Ozu, Tarkovsky, Lynch, Herzog, and many others, have not only redefined the possibilities of cinema, but they have presented profound, uniquely cinematic contributions to thinking, a gift that is squandered if we are unwilling to confront these works first and foremost as films.

Sinnerbrink turns to Deleuze and Cavell as two pioneers of film-philosophy in which cinema is approached for what only cinema can do. Cinema may, as Deleuze argued, provide a "shock to thought" (137), but cinema does not need philosophy in order to fulfill itself as cinema. It can do so on its own terms, namely through images (91). Philosophy rather encounters film on its own terms, but in talking about film, Deleuze tells us, we "become philosophers" because "cinema's concepts are not given in cinema. And yet they are cinema's concepts, not theories about cinema" [Deleuze, Cinema 2: The Time-Image, trans. Hugh Tomlinson and Robert Galeta (Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1989), 280]. Cavell, too, performs a model of how philosophy and film can think together (102). Both also see in the rise of film-art a restoration of our sundered relationship to the world, addressing for Cavell the problem of skepticism and Deleuze the problem of nihilism. In a sense, film-art not only gives us something worth thinking about, it helps make thinking again worthwhile.

The second valence of the book could also be read as a contextualization and hermeneutic accounting for how Sinnerbrink thinks about certain films and what kinds of films he finds particularly worth thinking about. Sinnerbrink, admirably in my judgment, turns to films that challenge the habits and ideological assumptions (what Deleuze called "sensory motor linkages") that allow us to take our world for granted. This is an explicitly ethical issue:

In a global cultural and economic marketplace dominated by certain types of stories or ideological points of view, there is ethical purpose in devoting attention to more marginal, more questioning, more aesthetically and intellectually demanding films that one encounters (139).

It is from this stance that Sinnerbrink frames the most interesting part of his work, namely his film-philosophic analyses of Lynch, von Trier, and Malick. In a sense, the whole book is a set up for these readings, but it allows us, for example, to appreciate the "audacity of The New World's romanticism," which allows "through cinematic poetry, nature to reveal or disclose itself as a 'subject'" (192). This is not Grand Theory, but nothing less than the reinvigoration of thinking in these troubled times.