New Romantic Cyborgs: Romanticism, Information Technology, and the End of the Machine

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Mark Coeckelbergh, New Romantic Cyborgs: Romanticism, Information Technology, and the End of the Machine, MIT Press, 2017, 320 pp., $50.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780262035460

Reviewed by Andrew Pickering, University of Exeter


The title of Mark Coeckelbergh's book is somewhat deceptive. I approached it from an interest in cyborgs and information technology, but I learned little new about them. Instead, I learned more than I wanted about romanticism. Part I of the book, a third of the text, is about the history of romanticism in the 18th and 19th centuries, running from Jean-Jacques Rousseau to William Morris and the Arts and Crafts Movement, and then into the 20th century with Max Weber, Martin Heidegger, Walter Benjamin and Leo Marx, and even a surprising nod to Rachel Carson, the scientist who analysed the risks of chemical agriculture in her 1962 book, Silent Spring (91).

Before I picked up New Romantic Cyborgs, I would have said that romanticism was simply anti-science and technology -- a rejection of science and machinery -- an attitude of repulsion by them. But drawing on and quoting amply from an extensive secondary literature, Coeckelbergh paints a more complex and nuanced picture. Avoiding any sharp, unitary definition, he variously associates romanticism with fascination with the sublime, Gothic motifs, transcendence and enchantment. I found the last of these the most useful to hang onto. In modernity, as Max Weber argued, science and engineering have disenchanted the world. In place of the wonders of gods, spirits and the divine, now we have a bunch of equations that anyone with the right sort of education can grasp and oafish machines imposing their (and our) will on a defenceless nature. This is what romantics resent.

So, was I right to equate romanticism with anti-science? Not entirely. Part II complicates the picture interestingly. Not all sciences are repulsive to romantics. Some of them maintain and even intensify an aura of enchantment -- early ballooning, for instance, and Freudian psychiatry. Mesmerism and its descendant, hypnotism, are nice examples that still fascinate and mystify people. Think of the science fiction of Jules Verne and H. G. Wells. At another extreme, big industrial machines can evoke wonder, awe and fear -- think of the description of being literally floored by witnessing a gigantic dynamo in The Education of Henry Adams (my example, not Coeckelbergh's). Though Coeckelbergh does not spell it out, perhaps the point to grasp here is that his account moves from romanticism as a stance of human actors to 'romanticness' as an attribute of knowledges and objects.

And then we can see how information technology and cyborgs can fit into the picture. Cyborgs obviously help re-enchant the world. What could be more wonderful, and possibly sublime, than Arnold Schwarzenegger the human/machine Terminator, or the artist Stelarc attached to a robotic third-arm controlled by others over the internet? Baron Frankenstein's reassembled and reanimated monster looms large here, of course. The early literature on cybernetic robots (not mentioned in the book) is likewise full of references to the sorcerer's apprentice and the Golem of Prague -- animated and enchanted clay. Coeckelbergh's favourite examples of information technologies, computer tablets and smartphones are somewhat harder to subsume under the romantic rubric, and much of the rhetoric of Chapter 5, 'Romanticism with the Machine,' struck me as overblown. Lacking a smartphone, I find it hard to credit their 'extraordinary mystical and religious properties' (160). But imagine having a limitless source of information in your pocket, or jumping into the Gothic scenarios of many videogames, and you can make some sort of connection to romanticism easily enough.

This chapter concludes with glances towards surveillance technologies, algorithmic art, Donna Haraway's famous cyborg manifesto, 'romantic robots,' Kevin Warwick as a real-life cyborg, transhumanism (which wants to be anti-romantic but dreams of immortality), Ray Kurzweil's vision of the coming 'Singularity,' the Internet of Things, augmented reality, the foundations of quantum mechanics (Albert Einstein once used the word 'spooky' 203), particle physics, astronomy, and even economics. All of these are said to re-enchant the world in one way or another, and you could be forgiven for thinking that the book reaches its destination here: the new machines of the 21st century are bringing back the romance that the clunky tools of the Industrial Revolution took away from us.

This is indeed an important part of the message, but then comes a reversal, promised and postponed since the opening preview. In Chapter 6, the penultimate chapter, Coeckelbergh rehearses philosophical critiques of romanticism from Irving Babbitt, Isaiah Berlin, Karl Popper and Herbert Marcuse (who serves to bring machines into the discussion), and agrees with them. Amongst other political and moral failings, romanticism is a species of escapism, fleeing from the grim actualities of real life. It is thus a bad thing that smartphones and robots can fitted into the romantic narrative.

Where does this leave us? An obvious conclusion would be that while it is possible to focus on the romantic aspects of information technologies and cyborgs, we should not. We should just accede to the disenchantment of the modern world. This whole romantic trip (more than 200 pages at this point) was a mistake; we should never have embarked on it. But without much argument, in the last chapter Coeckelbergh shoots off in another direction. The analysis thus far has been cast in a dualist framework: romanticism is either a human attitude or a property of objects. And Coeckelbergh announces that our next step should be to transcend this human/nonhuman duality, and romanticism along with it. This is, for him, a major leap into the unknown, something to be floated at the end of the book, that cannot be explored in any depth. One suggestion is that we should think about skilled engagements with the world as the site of nondualist connections. Another is to experiment with premodern language: let's try getting gods and spirits back into our thinking about technology. 'Technologies always had a magical function' (269). He notes, of course, that this threatens to re-enchant the world yet again. Perhaps we just cannot get away from romanticism; perhaps there is no outside. Thesis, antithesis, synthesis -- and then back to the start.

Those of us who have been keeping up with science and technology studies can only applaud Coeckelbergh's attempt to get beyond dualism. I confess I have myself recently recommended thinking of nuclear power stations as temperamental deities. But if the whole academic obsession with dualism and modernity dates back to 1993 and Bruno Latour's We Have Never Been Modern -- cited by Coeckelbergh -- an awful lot has been worked out since then that Coeckelbergh appears not to know about. Perhaps he is content to largely ignore the STS literature because he cares more about romanticism than about science and technology. Conversely, from an STS perspective, this long voyage though romanticism seems like a perverse way to stumble upon the couplings of people and things.