New Scholasticism Meets Analytic Philosophy

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Rafael Hüntelmann and Johannes Hattler (eds.), New Scholasticism Meets Analytic Philosophy, Editiones Scholasticae, 2014, 128pp., $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 9783868385458.

Reviewed by Anna Marmodoro, University of Oxford


This volume contributes to the exciting international conversations that are currently developing among metaphysicians of different ‘affiliations’: (neo-)Aristotelians and (neo-)Thomists on the one hand, and analytic philosophers on the other. This dialogue is important. Aristotle’s and Aquinas’ texts, when approached from a contemporary philosophical perspective, may well offer significant insights that a merely textual/historical reading might not bring out. Scholars and philosophers alike have much to gain from such an exercise.

To my mind, Rafael Hüntelmann and Johannes Hattler, the editors, make too limited a claim when suggesting in their preface that the ‘formal similarities’ between scholastic and analytic philosophy are what allow for dialogue, despite the ‘differences in content’. Ancient and medieval philosophers engaged with philosophical questions that are much the same as ours. These common lines of inquiry facilitate and make the dialogue fruitful.  Contemporary philosophers have made use of Aristotle’s insights in discussions in areas such as functionalism, essentialism, virtue ethics, and more recently virtue epistemology.

A second reason the dialogue is important is that it might help untangle what’s due to whom: what is genuinely Aristotelian thought; what is distinctive of Thomism (as opposed to a Thomistic rephrasing of Aristotle’s views); and how contemporary philosophy moves Aristotle’s and Aquinas’ ideas in new directions. Putting philosophers from the past into conversation with current philosophers is not an easy undertaking. Those committed to such a dialogue need to bear in mind the risk of unduly ‘flattening out’ important philosophical differences or ignoring issues of translation and interpretation of the ancient texts t. Teamwork is the best way to address this concern, and this volume takes a step in that direction.

The volume includes six essays. (Regrettably, Erwin Tegtmeier’s has a different title in the Table of Contents than in the text itself). The first, by Uwe Meixner, is on ‘the matter of materiality’ (sic). He argues that even from a contemporary and scientifically informed perspective, ‘there is . . . conceptual room enough both for according . . . causal powers [that are efficacious in the physical world] to immaterial particulars and for respecting the laws of physics’ (p. 16; emphasis in the original). The philosophical questions surrounding this view are very difficult; the crux is how an immaterial entity can exercise causal efficacy on a material one. Regrettably, Meixner does not even raise the issue. (It would also help if he told more about the kinds of immaterial particulars he is thinking of: god, angels or more ‘mundane’ ones such as numbers?).

Edward Feser, focuses on Aquinas’ principle of causality (PC): ‘if a potency is actualized, that can only be because some already actual cause actualized it’ (p. 19; emphasis in the original). (It would have been interesting to learn more about how Aquinas derives this from Aristotle’s principles.) Feser examines some of the difficulties raised in modern times against PC, and some of the arguments, e.g., the principle of sufficient reason (PSR) that the Scholastics employed to defend it. The Scholastics used PSR in the following way in support of PC:

if PC were false — if the actualization of a potency, the existence of a contingent thing, or something’s changing or coming into being could lack a cause — then these phenomena would not be intelligible, would lack a sufficient reason or adequate explanation. Hence if PSR is true, PC must be true. (p. 37)

Let us pause to examine the inference from PSR to PC. Is it a valid one? PSR is about what makes the world intelligible to us. It involves reasons we give in our explanations of how things are, or how they happen. But the PC is about causes, not reasons. The two sets are not co-extensive. What makes a state of affairs intelligible may be other than its causes. To show that it has to be limited to its causes would require further argument. It would be interesting to hear more from Feser about how the Scholastics could respond to this critique.  

Feser goes on to consider what justifies assuming that PSR is true. He reviews a number of existing lines of argument in defense of PSR, ranging from the Scholastics’ to those of contemporary metaphysicians’. He also contributes an argument of his own: if PSR were false, the very possibility of rational justification of one’s views would be compromised. ‘Hence to doubt or deny PSR undercuts any grounds we could have for doubting or denying PSR. . . . To reject PSR is to undermine the possibility of any rational inquiry’ (p. 43; emphasis in the original). The overall conclusion of the chapter is that

All rational inquiry, and scientific inquiry in particular, presupposes PSR. But PSR entails PC. Therefore PC cannot coherently be denied in the name of science. It must instead be regarded as part of the metaphysical framework within which all scientific results must be interpreted. (p. 44)

The validity of the conclusion however depends on the entailment already questioned, about which it would be good to hear more.

Erwin Tegtmeier shows historical sensitivity to the ancient and medieval texts he engages with; he teases out well the views of Aristotle Aristotle’s predecessors and Aquinas. On the other hand, he misunderstands Aristotle’s position on potentiality (or power or potency) and thus his account of change. Tegtmeier attributes to Aristotle the view that ‘potency . . . [is] the half existence of the nature [of something]: bread dough can become bread but cake dough does not because breadhood is already in the former though not fully. Full existence is assigned only to the nature in act’ (p. 53). Tegtmeier claims that Aristotle ‘explicitly’ uses the concept of half-existence to account for potency. But his only evidence for this totally implausible claim is that ‘Aristotle grades relational accidents as “least a being” and he considers accidents in general as lesser beings than substances’ (p. 53).

I see nothing in these textual references suggesting that Aristotle thought of potentialities or powers as half-existences. How can Teigtmeier deem Aristotle’s account of potentiality non-sensical (p. 57) and inferior to Aquinas’s account (p. 56), when his understanding of it is poor? Following this misreading of Aristotle’s position, Tegtmeier attributes to him a self-contradicting account of change, where the supposed (and nonexistent) contradiction follows from Aristotle’s thinking that i) potency and actuality are ‘incompatible’ and that ii) ‘becoming and change imply potency as well as actuality of the target attribute’ (p. 55).. Tegtmeier proceeds to find addditional (supposed) contradictions in Aristotle:

Moreover, Aristotle advocates the ordinary and contradictory view of change as transition between opposing attributes. It is contradictory since it implies the predication of an attribute to the changing object and its negation. Aristotle’s ultimate way out of the contradiction seems not to lead via potency but rather through temporalization of the law of contradiction. (p. 55)

This ‘temporalization’ is, according to Tegtmeier, unacceptable to contemporary logicians and ontologists. He provides no justification for this claim. One wonders how Tegtmeier understands the meaning of ‘contradiction’ as he attributes so many to Aristotle.

Tegtmeier argues for the superiority of fact ontologies over ‘thing ontologies’ (where Aristotle’s is an example of the latter) in providing an account of becoming and change. His conclusion is grounded on the fact that ‘Potency is necessary because Aristotle does not recognize actual complexes [sc. mereological sums] as existent. A major achievement of fact ontologies is that they are able to make sense of such actual complexes in which the constituents are present’ (p. 61). Contrary to what Tegtmeier claims, Aristotle did admit mereological sums in his ontology (see, for example, the classification of types of unity in Metaphysics book V), but did not accord them the primary and fundamental role of substances. At any rate it remains altogether unclear what philosophical connections Tegtmeier sees among potentiality, mereological sums, facts, and ‘things’. It is regretable that Tegtmeier’s arguments are so ill-grounded with respect to understanding the ancient ontologies he criticizes.

David Oderberg’s chapter concerns the metaphysics of privation, which underpins Augustine’s, Aquinas’ and other medieval accounts of evil as privation of the good. Oderberg raises and briefly but deftly discusses many difficult philosophical issues related to privation, particularly what might be truthmakers for negative truths, and how privations can enter into causal relations. If they can’t, evil would cause nothing; and if only what is causal is real, evil would not be real — which is clearly a position no one would want to hold. Oderberg argues that the key move to make to account for the reality of evil, albeit it is a privation, is to think of evil along the lines of an Aristotelian universal. Evil is a ‘mental object . . . the result of apprehending real being in the world’ (p. 84), just as universals are abstractions from the particulars they are immanent in. Evil qua privation of the good — but not universals — supervenes on something in the world. The supervenience base of privations is the combination of two positive states: potentiality and need in the deprived subject.As Oderberg explains in his definition of evil: ‘Evil is a privation of a kind of fulfillment. The relevant kind of fulfillment belongs to the nature of a thing — how it is supposed to function given the kind of thing it is’ (p. 64; emphasis in the original). Take the paradigmatic case of living beings: ‘Privation consists in the absence of something in an organism . . . but in addition involves [essentially] the organism’s needing what is absent for its fulfilling. . . . The state of need is a state of being in potentiality towards something that if present will actualize the potentiality’ (p. 72). The overall metaphysical framework is very Aristotelian; within it and as an interpretation of the targeted medieval views, Oderberg delivers a compelling account of evil.

Edmund Runggaldier makes a ‘plea’ (his words) for causal pluralism in contemporary metaphysics, that is, for adding formal and material causation to efficient causation. His ‘plea’ is an important and timely one; it echoes others currently being made along similar lines from different angles. It is plausible to expect that these multiple efforts will bring about in due course a real shift in contemporary metaphysics, which is exciting to see unfold. Runggaldier’s main focus is the ‘rehabilitation’ of formal causation. If downwards causation is acceptable to modern science, why should the formal causes of the Aristotelian and scholastic tradition not be acceptable, too? So argues Runggaldier. But what is formal causation? How can Aristotelian forms be made relevant to contemporary scientific and philosophical discussion? Runggaldier takes a formal cause to be a ‘structural formal principle’ operating on matter (p. 91); whereby ‘this structuring of matter brings forth and stabilizes a possible material organization’ (p. 92). Even this very brief sketch of formal causation is dense with difficult concepts. It would have helped make the case be taken seriously had Runggaldier given a fuller explanation of the key ideas, particularly of how a formal cause does its metaphysical work.

After a brief review of Aristotle’s and the Scholastics’ views, Runggaldier concentrates mostly on presenting how Suárez understood formal causation as ‘internal’ causation (by contrast with efficient, external causation), with Suárez explaining the internality of formal causation along these lines:

The form is ontologically dependent on matter. It originates together with the compositum. Forms and their causal role always presuppose the material elements which constitute the whole individual. On the other hand, matter is in a sense — at least for the Thomists — the effect of the form, since matter as such, without being informed by some form, does not exist. (p. 102).

Suárez’s position requires much more ‘unpacking’, but it is very good to have it on the map for consideration by contemporary metaphysicians.

Stephen Mumford and Rani L. Anjum present their view that causal powers are governed by a distinctive and irreducible modality: neither necessity nor contingency, but rather, dispositional modality. They offer a terse résumé of their arguments in support of this proposal (initially made in their Getting Causes from Powers, OUP 2011), and of the domain of application where proponents claim it can do useful metaphysical work. In addition, Mumford and Anjum investigate whether their view has precedents in the history of philosophy; they think Aquinas’s is a promising close view, and arguably Aristotle’s.

In this connection, they disagree with an alternative view regarding the modality of causal powers. This alternative is conditional (or physical) necessity; it is the view I defend, and find in Aristotle. Mumford and Anjum engage directly with my position (p. 112), which I will restate for the sake of drawing the contrast:

physical necessity does not determine what will come to be under any circumstances, come what may; it determines what will come to be under specific circumstances, only if and when such circumstances obtain. So, for instance, fire makes wood burn, unless the wood is wet. What is characteristic of the modality of things that happen according to nature is that it is a defeasible modality. We could describe this type of physical modality as conditional necessity, in order to indicate that it is governed by obtaining circumstances. (Marmodoro, forthcoming)

Mumford and Anjum take the difference between the two views to be that, on theirs, ‘when a power is in all the right conditions for its manifestation, it still ’only’ tends, and no more than tends, to produce its effect, where such tendencies can come in greater and lesser strength’ (p. 112); whilst on the conditional necessity view, when all the required conditions are right, a power necessarily manifests. One might want to press them on what they mean, metaphysically, by ‘tending’ or ‘tendencies’: their position is that it is an irreducible notion, which does not make more intelligible what they mean. Additionally, tending would have to be added as a primitive to the ontology, and general consideration of parsimony speaks against this move if the metaphysical work that tending supposedly does can be done otherwise, without loss of explanatory power, by what is already part of the ontology.

Against conditional necessity, Mumford and Anjum argue that it collapses into necessity (on this point more below). But in my understanding of their position, their dispositional modality — the mere tending that characterizes powers — collapses (at best) into contingency: if when all the conditions are right powers still merely tend towards manifesting, it seems that whether they manifest or not is just chance. What other factor is there to causally explain the manifestation? If not this way, i.e., ultimately as collapsing into chance, the only alternative appears to be that that they manifest (or not) by necessity. For, suppose a radiator has a weak tendency to warm the environment. A weak tendency, on Mumford and Anjum’s view, is not a power that produces a small amount of heat in the environment — this would be necessary heating, not tendency to heat. They mean that it is a weak tendency to manifest, which does not depend on external circumstances for its manifestation. What does it depend on? If it is in principle too weak a tendency to manifest, then it is questionable that this is a power — an in principle ‘non-manifestable power’; also, the corresponding strong tendencies would manifest by necessity. If it might manifest despite its weakness, but also it might not, independently of external circumstances, then it is chance.

Mumford and Anjum challenge the coherence of the conditional necessity view on two grounds: i) that ‘The very idea of necessity seems to mean unconditional necessity’; and ii) ‘if we allow necessity to be conditional — something that operates when all conditions are right — then every truth will turn out to be likewise necessary, destroying any distinction between contingent and necessary truths’ (p. 111). But the very idea of condition introduces contingency, in case the conditions were not satisfied. This discussion could develop either along metaphysical or epistemological lines.

In conclusion, this collection is a valuable and stimulating read at the forefront of an important developing trend in metaphysics. The book will interest a wide range of readers and draw a variety of reactions. But even those unsympathetic to the dialogue between ancient and medieval philosophy, on the one hand, and contemporary philosophy, on the other, will enjoy the earnest spirit of inquiry into the respective fields that all the contributors display.