New Thinking about Propositions

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Jeffrey C. King, Scott Soames, and Jeff Speaks, New Thinking about Propositions, Oxford University Press, 2014, 252pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199693764.

Reviewed by Peter Hanks, University of Minnesota


Almost always, when I am occupied by an article or book I am totally convinced by the author's arguments and find myself in complete agreement. The effect can be fleeting, but it is powerful. In the moment I am on board and nodding along. I don't encourage this effect -- I try to be as stubborn and skeptical as everyone else -- but it happens anyway. I see this as a good thing. There is a phenomenological aspect to giving something a fair hearing. Appreciating a philosophical position requires taking up residence in that position, at least temporarily, and if that doesn't happen when you are in the middle of it then I don't know when it will.

This happened to me when I was reading this book, but in an interesting and unusual way. Here are three different philosophers, each defending a different view about the nature of propositions, criticizing each other's positions, and responding to these criticisms. The three philosophers are all extremely good, each of the three views is deeply interesting, the criticisms are sharp and perceptive, and the responses are clever and persuasive. Over the course of the book I was pulled in all three directions and back again multiple times. Overall this has a scorched earth effect, with all three views coming out looking battered and diminished. It made for exciting reading, but I worry that Jeffrey King, Scott Soames, and Jeff Speaks have done themselves a disservice by presenting their views in this manner. Perhaps, though, the aim was not so much to advance any particular theory about the nature of propositions but to set the terms of the debate and lock in the leading positions. If that was the goal, then I think the book will be an unmitigated success.

The theories that King, Soames, and Speaks defend in this book are motivated by dissatisfaction with the traditional idea that propositions are the primary bearers of truth-conditions and representational properties (like being about this or that). How do propositions get their truth-conditions and how do they get to be representations? We cannot appeal to beliefs or assertions or sentences, since these things derive their truth-conditions and representational properties from propositions. So propositions must have their truth-conditions and representational features "independently of minds and languages," as King puts it (47). Given this commitment, it is tempting to say that there is no need to explain any of this. Perhaps propositions are primitive bearers of truth-conditions and representational properties, which they have independently of minds and languages and everything else. King, Soames, and Speaks reject this. As Speaks remarks, "we all dislike the idea that propositions could be entities which are intrinsically representational -- in the sense that they both are representational and would exist and be representational, even if there were no subjects around to do any representing" (147). King, Soames, and Speaks therefore have to modify the traditional account of propositions in order to avoid this commitment.

Let me start with Speaks's view, since it is the simplest of the three theories. His idea is to deny that propositions are representations -- they have truth-conditions, but they are not about anything. Beliefs, assertions, and sentences have truth-conditions and are representational, for Speaks, and this is because of their relations to propositions, but propositions themselves are not representations. They are simply entities that are true or false, and fundamentally so. He implements this idea by identifying propositions with properties that are had by everything or nothing. For example, the proposition that Amelia talks is the property of being such that Amelia talks. If Amelia talks, then everything has this property and if she doesn't then nothing has it. Speaks then identifies truth with instantiation: the property of being such that Amelia talks is true iff it is instantiated, and it is instantiated iff Amelia talks. But like any property, this property is not about anything.

Soames puts his finger on the basic intuitive problem for Speaks's view when he points out that it "makes it difficult to capture the fact that truth is a kind of accuracy in representation. . . . a proposition is true when it represents things as they really are" (167). Speaks has a clever reply. Here is a platitude: something is true just in case it represents the world as being some way and the world is that way. But who says the platitude applies to everything that is true or false? Speaks suggests that it only applies to derivative bearers of truth and falsity, namely beliefs, assertions and sentences. He thinks that "it will be no surprise if the right account of truth and falsity for propositions is different from the right account of truth and falsity for the non-fundamental bearers of truth and falsity" (221). But this reply, and Speaks's view more generally, stands or falls with his identification of propositional truth with instantiation for global properties. The fact that this identification forces a decoupling of truth and representation is exactly what makes it implausible. Consider the following analogy. All three authors agree that ordered sets of objects and relations, e.g., the ordered pair <Amelia, the property of talking>, cannot serve as propositions. Why not? Because ordered sets are not true or false. But here is a property that ordered sets can have -- call it the property of being T: an ordered set <o1, o2, o3, . . . , on, Rn> is T just in case <o1, o2, o3, . . . , on,> instantiates Rn. There is nothing wrong with this definition. The property of being T is a perfectly kosher property, which some ordered sets have and some don't. So why not identify truth with the property of being T and then reduce propositions to ordered sets? Because ordered sets are not representations. The same goes for Speaks's properties. To put this another way, if Speaks's approach were successful, then we could use the same approach to show that ordered sets are propositions.

Speaks wants to give up one aspect of the traditional account of propositions while leaving the rest of its explanatory structure in place. King and Soames want to change its explanatory structure. King puts sentences before propositions. He thinks that the truth-conditions and representational features of sentences are explanatorily prior to those for propositions. The overall strategy is to identify propositions with certain facts or states of affairs that acquire their truth-conditions through the way we interpret them. Here is a rough analogy. The fact that there is a coffee mug on my desk is not true or false and is not about anything. It could be, though, if we took it to represent some other state of affairs. Suppose we all took the fact that the coffee mug is on my desk to represent the fact that the President is in the White House. This would endow the fact about the desk and coffee mug with truth-conditions -- it would be true iff the President is in the White House. According to King this is more or less how propositions get their truth-conditions. Now, the details get very complicated. I will only sketch the outlines. The facts that King identifies with propositions consist of objects, properties and relations bound together by amalgams of syntactic and semantic relations. Very roughly, if you start with a sentence, add the semantic values of the words in that sentence, and then take out the words, you will end up with one of King's facts. King thinks that we interpret these facts through the way we interpret the syntactic relations in the sentences out of which they are constructed. Again, very roughly, we take propositions to have truth-conditions because we take sentences to have truth-conditions. This is the sense in which, for King, the truth-conditions of sentences are explanatorily prior to the truth-conditions of propositions.

Interpreting a fact to represent some other state of affairs is a sophisticated cognitive achievement. Doing so surely requires having beliefs and intentions. The propositional contents of these beliefs and intentions obviously cannot be the ones generated by the acts of interpretation in which they are involved. King needs some other propositions to serve as the contents of these prior attitudes. This sets off a regress. Call the propositions generated by acts of interpreting sentences A-propositions. The propositional contents of the attitudes required for these acts of interpretation cannot be A-propositions. So call them B-propositions. Applying King's interpretative strategy to B-propositions yields another class of attitudes and another kind of proposition, C-propositions. And so on. I can see two ways for King to halt the regress, both of which are suggested by remarks he makes in the book. First, he could decline to give the interpretative story at some stage. Perhaps there are X-propositions that do not get their truth-conditions from acts of interpretation. King appears to go in this direction in a sketchy discussion of the propositional contents of perceptual experiences (194-95). The danger here is that this will introduce the very things that King set out to avoid in the first place, namely propositions that have truth-conditions independently of minds and languages. Alternatively, he could argue that it is possible to interpret something without having beliefs or intentions or any other propositional attitudes. Echoing remarks he made in (King 2007), he notes that "our prelinguistic ancestors could have had 'proto intentional' states that weren't relations to propositions and that these mental states could have been sufficient for them to bring language, and hence propositions, into existence" (60). I'll leave it to the reader to judge the plausibility of this move.

Soames also changes the explanatory structure of the traditional account of propositions, but he does so by making entertainment basic. (His part in this book is an update on (Soames 2010)). Traditionally, entertainment is understood as a kind of neutral cognitive contact between a person and a proposition, which is a necessary precursor to or ingredient in judgment and other attitudes. This is not how Soames conceives of entertainment. To entertain the proposition that a is F is, for Soames, to predicate the property of being F of a. To predicate F of a is to perform an action in which you represent a as F. This occurs, for example, when you think of a as F, or perceive a as F. Unlike traditional entertainment, which is a binary relation between a person and a proposition, Soamesian predication is a multi-grade relation that holds between people, objects, properties, relations. Like the traditional account, however, Soames preserves the idea that predication serves as a neutral core running through all the other attitudes. As he puts it, "it is the attitude on which the others are, in one way or another, based" (97). Acts of predication are also the explanatorily basic bearers of truth-conditions and representational properties. Propositions are types of these actions. The proposition that a is F is the minimal event type in which a subject predicates F of a. This type derives its truth-conditions and representational features from its actual or conceivable tokens. The proposition that a is F represents a as F because it is the minimal event type of predicating F of a, and in any conceivable token of this type a subject represents a as F.

The problem is that Soames's concept of predication is incoherent. To pursue this explanatory strategy Soames has to say that particular token acts of predication are true or false, or at least that in performing an act of predication the subject accurately or inaccurately represents how things are. This means that in performing an act of predication it is possible to make a mistake. If I predicate F of a, and a is not F, then my act of predication is false, I inaccurately represented a as F, and hence I made a mistake. At the same time, though, acts of predication are entirely neutral. For Soames, I take no stand on whether a is F when I predicate F of a. But then how could I make a mistake if a is not F? It is incoherent to suppose that I can remain neutral about whether a is F and yet potentially be wrong about whether a is F. No act can be both truth-evaluable and neutral in the way that Soames requires. It is worth noting that the same incoherence does not apply to the traditional concept of entertainment. In the usual sense, acts of entertaining propositions are neutral but they are not true or false. The proposition you entertain is true or false, but your act of entertaining it is not.

Conservatism in philosophy is not always a virtue. Sometimes a radical break with a prevailing framework is warranted. Whether they realize it or not, King, Soames, and Speaks are all trying to fix a traditional picture of propositions so that it can avoid primitive, intrinsic bearers of truth-conditions and representational properties, when in fact what we need is a completely different picture.


King, Jeffrey C. 2007. The Nature and Structure of Content. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Soames, Scott 2010. What is Meaning?. Princeton: Princeton University Press.