New Thoughts about Old Things: Cognitive Policies as the Ground of Singular Concepts

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Lawlor, Krista, New Thoughts about Old Things: Cognitive Policies as the Ground of Singular Concepts, Garland Publishing, 2001, xi + 148pp, $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 0-815-33963-1

Reviewed by Kent Bach, San Francisco State University


Epistemologists worry mostly about what it takes for beliefs to qualify as knowledge or to be at least justified. It is generally taken for granted that people know what the contents of their beliefs are. But lately, in connection with externalism about content (not to be confused with externalism about knowledge or justified belief), a debate has arisen on whether we need empirical information in order to know the contents of our own beliefs. For example, in light of Putnam’s classic Twin-Earth scenario, do we need the empirical information that the common clear liquid that falls as rain and fills lakes and rivers is H2O rather than XYZ in order to know that we believe water quenches thirst? Now Krista Lawlor has raised a rather different question about our access to the contents of our beliefs.

This rigorously argued and meticulously written monograph is concerned with a very difficult question: what does it take to ensure that a thought ostensibly about a previously encountered individual really is about the individual one takes it to be about? This question may be couched in terms of validating the form of an inference. Consider the oldest inference in the book:

All men are mortal. Socrates is a man. So, Socrates is mortal.

In order for this inference to be valid, ‘Socrates’ must refer to the same individual in both of its occurrences. Since there is no guarantee that it does, we need to be on guard against the possibility that it does not. Accordingly, Lawlor asks, “how does one attain defeasible warrant for trading on the presumed coreference of one’s mental terms?” (40), and seeks “an account of how it is that one’s taking terms to corefer could be a good guide to one’s terms actually coreferring” (45).

It is important to understand that, contrary to what she advertises in the preface, Lawlor is not offering an account of singular thought itself. Although she does raise the question of “what makes possible the possession of singular concepts” and indicates that “this book is an effort to answer that question” (xi), it is clear from the ensuing discussion that she is really addressing questions about the warranted exercise of singular concepts. She does not take up accounts of what is involved in thinking of an individual one is perceiving, remembers, or is informed of (see Evans 1982 for an original account and Bach 1987/1994 and Recanati 1993 for derivative ones), and she does not acknowledge the fundamental difference between thinking of an object in a de re way and merely under a description. In fact, it is unclear what sort of account of singular thought she favors, except that it utilizes the notion of sense. But we are told simply that sense is “that semantic entity that determines reference” (7).

Lawlor begins by considering Paul Boghossian’s well-known contention, in regard to Twin-Earth thought-experiments, that semantic externalism is incompatible with the “epistemic transparency of thought” (5), entailing that one cannot know a priori the logical properties of one’s thoughts. Externalism seems to imply that a trans-world traveler must be aware of empirical facts to know, e.g., that he is thinking that water quenches thirst. Lawlor is not so much interested in this issue (there is now an extensive literature on it) as she is in pointing out that it is symptomatic of a much more down-to-earth problem: “ordinary lapses of attention, ordinary mishaps and swaps of referents will make a priori certainty in the matter of sameness of reference at different times impossible” (14). We are all “susceptible to equivocation” (13), she cautions, but even if we cannot achieve perfect certainty, she assures us that we can generally avoid error about our references by exercising “epistemic vigilance … in thinking of things as the same…. One’s warrant in making trades on presumed coreference derives from one’s own efforts to make sure that the presuppositions of one’s inferences hold true” (21).

In the second chapter Lawlor examines John Campbell’s (1987) effort to develop an account of sense as “diachronically transparent,” and in the third chapter she examines Ruth Millikan’s (1997) account of “thinking with coreferential purport” (this is Lawlor’s admittedly “ugly” catch phrase, not Millikan’s), as well as what she calls the “node” model. Her critique of these accounts is incisive but constructive. By successively identifying various suggestive difficulties in the other accounts, she progressively sets the stage for her own. For example, instead of abandoning the standard context-independent notion of validity, as Campbell does, she proposes that one can have a priori access to the contents of one’s own thoughts and inferences without having to be infallible about them. Thus she reconciles a priori access with defeasibility. Also, she shows why the node model cannot represent how we can tentatively accept an identity or even undo the acceptance of one.

In the last two chapters, Lawlor develops her own account. Unfortunately, she does not clearly separate what is involved in (a) “knowing the logical powers of one’s inferences” (71), (b) continuing to believe things about something, (c) coming to believe new things about something one already has beliefs about, and (d) re-identifying something previously encountered (more examples would have been helpful). She adopts (and adapts) the popular metaphor of files of information to explain what is involved in maintaining defeasible warrant for “trading on presumed coreference.” The epistemic vigilance required for achieving this requires “establishing and maintaining a tradition or policy of use of a mental term type … and of maintaining a file about (purportedly) an individual … [by using] various sorts of file-management” (23). Here is her main thesis:

one is warranted in trading on presumed coreference just in case (i) one attempts to maintain an intentional relation to a referent, and (ii) one is reliable in one’s attempt, and (iii) one has some access to the grounds of one’s reliability, and (iv) one’s reliability in this matter arises from one’s epistemic vigilance. (72)

The plausibility of this half internalist, half externalist thesis rests partly on Lawlor’s subtle exposure of deficiencies in other views and partly on the appeal of her file-management model and her account of how the “sensitivity to one’s files” (91) needed for epistemic vigilance consists in “a disposition to self-correction, … to correct one’s screening and pruning dispositions” (107).

Space does not permit discussing Lawlor’s account in detail. She aims to respond to the skeptical suggestion that “the sense of a mental term tokened in one thought might differ from the sense of another term of the same type in a second thought, without the thinker’s a priori knowledge of the difference,” (27), and attempts to flesh out what underlies “thinking with coreferential purport” and “trading on presumed coreference.” She does this by explaining the benefits of “sensitivity to one’s files” and “detection of one’s own characteristic screening and pruning dispositions,” provided these dispositions have the required reliability. Her discussion takes a decidedly pragmatic turn and, despite how she originally posed her main question, it seems to me that she does not attend enough to the representational requirements on the “mechanics of coreferential thinking.” She often alludes to the handling and management of information without adequately considering how this information is represented. But that is part of the question at issue, since the same information can be represented in different ways.

Recall that Lawlor is trying to give “an account of how it is that one’s taking terms to corefer could be a good guide to one’s terms actually coreferring.” This seems to presuppose that we are somehow in a position to manage and manipulate their own mental representations. Even if we do not do this actively and reflectively but merely have unreflective but sensitive dispositions for doing this, we must somehow have cognitive access to our mental representations in order to monitor them. I don’t know about you, but my mental representations are utterly opaque to me. The best I can do is recognize what words I am inclined to use to express my thoughts. When I think about Socrates, for example, I am unaware of the vehicle whereby I think of him, and I am unaware of any sense associated with that vehicle. Insofar as I might ask myself whether I am thinking of the same guy as before when I am disposed to use the name ‘Socrates’ to refer (or during the course of an inference like the classic one about Socrates’ being mortal), I am asking a question about my use of the natural language name ‘Socrates’, not the mental representation whereby I think of him. Unless I am badly misconstruing Lawlor, a possibility I cannot rule out given the intelligence displayed on every page of this book, the question she is addressing is predicated on the undefended assumption that we are in a position to represent our mental representations, the vehicles by which they think of individuals (and their properties and relations). (Lawlor herself is neutral about the nature of these vehicles—she does “not endorse the ’language of thought’ hypothesis” (5n) but offers no alternative to it.)

The meta-representational capacity that Lawlor seems to assume we have also includes the capacity to think of the senses of representations. In this regard she apparently goes further than Frege, who did not suppose that when we “grasp” the sense of a term we are aware of its sense (along with its referent). Lawlor rejects Campbell’s assumption that “grasping sameness [must] guarantee that one knows that terms which purport to corefer actually do corefer,” and opts for the view that “something weaker might suffice to warrant a thinker in trading on coreference,” supposing that this weaker accomplishment “involves both one’s grasping a sense and its seeming to one that one grasps sameness of sense” (72). At first she makes it sound as though only reflective thinkers can exercise the requisite epistemic vigilance: “Unreflective thinkers, thinkers who are not on guard against error, and who take no particular precautions in their inferences, are in fact susceptible to equivocation … [and] simply rely on their mental term types to do the job” (13). But later she suggests that “one’s unreflective epistemic dispositions are … the place to look for the source of one’s justification in taking mental terms to corefer” and that “grasping a sense … involve[s] those of unreflective mechanisms—mechanisms whose net effect is to make one reliable about having thought of the Same” (22). Even if these mechanisms are unreflective, it would seem, at least as she formulates her main question, that sensitivity to the sorts of things necessary for maintaining epistemic vigilance about coreference requires some ability to have thoughts about one’s mental representations and their senses. Otherwise, how can this sensitivity be realized? How can these mechanisms operate without representations to operate on?

Even if we grant the meta-representational assumption, there seems to be a further difficulty. If we can monitor our mental representations and engage in the sort of cognitive bookkeeping Lawlor imagines, her question concerning thinking new thoughts about old things becomes a question concerning thinking new thoughts about old mental representations. That is, the epistemic demand that she thinks we must meet in order not to think about the wrong thing can only be met if we meet the further demand not to think with the wrong mental representation. But that requires monitoring these representations. So it seems that the meta-representational assumption combined with Lawlor’s views about cognitive bookkeeping leads to a vicious regress. The problem about tracking objects, which her account is supposed to solve, resurfaces as a problem about tracking their representations.

Curiously, at one point Lawlor notes that her “formulation in meta-linguistic terms, rather than object-level terms …, is required to prevent a regress” (28n), and later makes clear the futility of making a “mediate” inference involving a “middle term” (these are Millikan’s terms). For example, in regard to the argument that Socrates is mortal, the problem of ensuring that the two occurrences of ‘Socrates’ corefer can’t be solved by inserting subscripts and adding an identity premise:

All men are mortal. Socrates1 is a man. Socrates1 is Socrates2. So, Socrates2 is mortal.

Obviously the problem of coreference recurs, with respect to both the two occurrences of ‘Socrates1’ and the two occurrences of ‘Socrates2’. But it seems that Lawlor’s meta-representational account, insofar as it requires “its seeming to one that one grasps sameness of sense,” involves a regress of its own.

What is the alternative? Somehow we must able to keep our thoughts on particular individuals without having to guard against representational equivocation. Somehow, this capacity must be built into our cognitive architecture. Lawlor rightly points out that Perry’s file-merge model of representing coreferential purport is too weak, in that it “leaves one no room for merely pondering identifications” (63) and “too little room for undoing coreferential thought” (64; see Forbes 1989 for some brief suggestions that provide for both), but it seems that the meta-representational demand imposed by her file-management model is too strong.

Perhaps I have read too much into Lawlor’s model. She claims that we possess not just “capacities for reflective or meta-cognitive thought” but “many unreflective dispositions whose aim is the maintenance of correct information about individuals as individuals,” which are, she believes, “the place to look for the source of one’s justification in taking mental terms to corefer” (22). Yet this very way of putting her point (“taking mental terms to corefer”) invokes the troubling meta-representational assumption. On the other hand, “grasping a sense again does involve a host of unreflective mechanisms” (22), in which “we must allow a certain degree of trust” (28). Her later (ch. 4) discussion of what these mechanisms do, and what they have to do in order for “trading on presumed coreference” to be warranted, does not really include an account of how they do what they do. Either these mechanisms do involve representations of one’s representations (and their senses) or they do not. If they do, the problems mentioned above seem to arise. If they do not, then it is a mystery how they work. The only way out of this dilemma is to take a less internalist approach, one that does not require constant vigilance of the sort Lawlor demands. Then the capacity of warrant trading on presumed coreference would be built into our cognitive architecture and its natural workings, rather than on our vigilant control over it.

This is a brilliant book in many ways. So I wonder whether my skepticism about people’s ability to engage in meta-representational file management with the vigilance that Lawlor’s account seems to require isn’t the product of some meta-representational blindspot. If her account of the mechanics of coreferential thinking and the dispositions it involves does not make the meta-representational assumption that it seems to make, it needs to include an account of how these dispositions get realized otherwise. The present monograph is actually her dissertation, and one hopes that in future work she will integrate her account of thinking new thoughts about old things with a theory of singular thought itself and develop it with the help of relevant ideas in cognitive science.

Note: The publisher’s copy editor was asleep at the wheel: there are scattered (harmless) typos, the index is skimpy, and many of the bibliographical references are incomplete (Millikan 1997 is cited as appearing in the wrong year in the wrong journal). References

Bach, Kent (1987/1994), Thought and Reference, pbk. ed., revised with postscript, Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Campbell, John (1987), “Functional Role and Truth Conditions: Is Sense Transparent?” Aristotelian Society Supplementary Volume 61: 273-292.

Evans, Gareth (1982), Varieties of Reference, Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Forbes, Graeme (1989), “Cognitive Architecture and the Semantics of Belief,” Midwest Studies in Philosophy 14: 84-100.

Millikan, Ruth Garrett (1997), “Images of Identity: In Search of Modes of Presentation,” Mind 106: 499-519.

Recanati, François (1993), Direct Reference, Meaning, and Thought. Oxford: Blackwell.