New Waves in Aesthetics

Placeholder book cover

Kathleen Stock and Katherine Thomson-Jones (eds.), New Waves in Aesthetics, Palgrave Macmillan, 2008, 269pp., $38.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780230220478.

Reviewed by Derek Matravers, The Open University



This is a neat idea by Palgrave Macmillan: to run a series of books, each edited by people relatively early in their careers, with essays by others relatively early in their careers. This one contains a substantial and interesting introduction, and then thirteen essays on a wide variety of topics, from some of the best young philosophers working in the field of contemporary aesthetics.

The ‘wide variety of topics’ invites the question as to what exactly aesthetics is. In their helpful introduction the editors (who have done an excellent job) locate the collection firmly within the analytic (or more broadly, Anglo-American) tradition. There was certainly some aesthetics about at the beginning of this tradition (think of Moore’s remarks in Principia Ethica). J.O. Urmson is quoted as pursuing an interest in the subject in Oxford in the 1930s, but the two founding texts of the modern debate were William Elton’s 1954 collection Aesthetics and Language and Monroe Beardsley’s 1958 book, Aesthetics: Problems in the Philosophy of Criticism. Initially castigated as ‘dreary’ (by J.A. Passmore, in an essay reprinted in Elton’s collection) the subject began to attract philosophers of the calibre of Richard Wollheim and Nelson Goodman, followed, in the next generation, by the likes of Kendall Walton and Malcolm Budd. Today it flourishes; it is popular among students and there are many among the Professoriate whose principal philosophical interest is aesthetics.

Including the editors, the contributors to the collection exhibit an interesting geographical spread. There are seven Americans, four Brits, a New Zealander, two Belgians, an Indian and a Canadian. Of the seven Americans, two are working in Britain and one in Canada, and of the four Brits, one is working in the States (as are the Indian and the New Zealander). The Belgians work in Britain and in Hong Kong. If one takes into account the fact that there are many more philosophers in the US than in Britain, this does lend support to the widespread view that it is easier to survive and prosper as an aesthetician in Britain than it is in the US. It is a little depressing that very good US and Canadian graduate students who are interested in aesthetics and have the potential to make a significant contribution need to turn elsewhere in order to make themselves more employable.

One feature of the Anglo-American approach to aesthetics (like its approach generally) is to shy away from system-building towards something more piecemeal: making clarificatory moves to solve particular problems. In their introduction the editors rightly reject criticisms that such an approach is sterile or trivialising. Once again, the selection of papers reflects this: they tend to be a-historical (Brian Soucek on ‘Personifying Art’ being the exception) and non-overlapping (although this last claim must be qualified — there are some ways in which some of them overlap, but, then again, any two things have an indefinite number of properties in common).

This approach is in many ways commendable, as there is plenty of clarificatory work to be done in solving plenty of particular problems. However, there is also a danger that something distinctive to the subject matter of aesthetics will be missed. There are many ways we could divide up the subject matter. One popular way is to divide it into two parts. The first is bound up with the nature of experience and the notion of beauty, the second (note the title of Beardsley’s book above) is an attempt to solve problems thrown up by art and art criticism. A second way to divide it up would be into problems distinctive to aesthetics, and problems that are more generally philosophical. Foremost among the first is a clutch of problems surrounding the notion of beauty: put crudely, how can a judgement that is grounded in the sensory experience of one individual be binding on other individuals? What is distinctive about the second is that aesthetics provides instances of more general problems (granted that the fact that they are instances from aesthetics might raise particular problems). For example, those interested in ontology might apply themselves to the ontology of works of art or of music (the essays by Irvin and Kania); those interested in expression might apply themselves to expression in music and in artefacts (Trivedi and Kulvicki); those interested in the philosophy of language might apply themselves to metaphor (McGonigal); those interested in the philosophy of mind might apply themselves to problems regarding creativity, regarding concepts, and regarding the imagination (essays by Stokes, Meskin, Friend and Weinberg); those interested in the metaphysics of value might apply themselves to meta-aesthetics (Schellekens). Of the three remaining essays, Soucek explores the origins and ramifications of our practice of personifying art and comes up with a conclusion that has wide-ranging implications, including implications for how we should view art. Costello takes a close look at recent work by Arthur Danto, and argues that it is not, and indeed Danto’s work never was, incompatible with Kantian aesthetics. Finally, in a complicated but important essay, de Clerq attempts to illuminate the nature of aesthetic judgements by exploring ways in which the beauty of an object depends on the sortal under which it falls. Of all the essays, this is the one that strays the most into problems distinctive of aesthetics (as distinct from ‘problems distinctive of those studied by aestheticians’).

This raises two questions for me. First, is there a connection between the piecemeal approach and the tendency to shy away from problems distinctive of aesthetics? Does one need to be a system-builder of a Kantian or Hegelian sort to illuminate the notion of beauty? Second, is anything lost by the focus on particular problems? To answer the first question one should first distinguish between systems of the Kantian and Hegelian sort and systems that sit more comfortably in the Anglo-American tradition. Beardsley, Wollheim and Budd did not (or do not) have a system; rather they have a set of claims that more or less hang together. Walton, on the other hand, does have a system although not one of a particularly Kantian or Hegelian sort. My own view is that one does not need to have a system of any sort; the most interesting recent progress towards explaining the problems distinctive of aesthetics can (I think) be found in the work of Malcolm Budd. However, I do think that that there are dangers in a piecemeal approach: we will make small and secure steps in clarifying expression, or sorting out the ontology of comics, while the fundamental problems — the problems that interested Kant and Hume, and, more recently, Frank Sibley — will remain untouched. In summary, what we learn from the book, from the excellent work being done by the young aestheticians around us, is that progress is being made on a number of smaller issues while the less tractable issues — distinctive of aesthetics — are put to one side.

I have touched on some of the essays in the forgoing. For the remainder of this review I shall say a little about two that particularly caught my attention (singling these out for comment is not a value judgement on either them or on the others). The first is an essay by Stacie Friend on Kendall Walton. Friend points out that, in Mimesis as Make-Believe, Kendall Walton presents a revisionary account of fiction: a fiction is something that has the function of serving as a prop in a game of make-believe. This will be much wider than our traditional notion of fiction (wider than even Walton admits). Friend’s question is whether the imagination can be used to make a distinction within Walton’s category: that is, to provide a division between our traditional concept of fiction and representations that are not fiction. She considers various options and finds them wanting, suggesting, instead, that the divide needs to be understood in terms of our on-going practices of producing fictions and non-fictions. I find Friend’s view convincing, and the implications (which she does not make explicit) quite radical. That is, there is no link between the imagination (or the propositional attitude of make-believe) and fiction traditionally conceived; there is no mental state distinctive of fiction traditionally conceived. The account we give of engaging with representations is independent of any account we might give as to whether or not any such representation is fictional.

The second is Dustin Stokes’ essay on creativity. This is a welcome addition to the rather scarce philosophical literature on the subject (the scarcity is pointed out by Stokes). One thing that is striking about this essay is how little Stokes is prepared to assert about creativity. He argues convincingly that our best bet is to treat creativity as a process, and that we should ‘begin with minimal conceptualisations of creative process’. Even setting his ambitions low, Stokes has difficulty in finding anything substantial to say. Agency is a necessary condition for being a creative process. Is novelty? Yes, in some degree and in some respects. (I can here state that I do not think there is any chance at all of specifying the respect in which novelty is relevant to creativity in a non-circular manner. I am baffled by those theorists who accept the implications of their theories that Haydn was a more creative composer than Mozart, or Damien Hirst a more creative artist than Lucien Freud.) Stokes goes on to say that some conception of value might be useful, and that incorporating a criterion involving cognitive change ‘looks promising’. None of this is to criticise Stokes; in fact, just the opposite. My strong suspicion is that his severely limited conclusions are a feature of the debate: there simply might not be much that is philosophically interesting to say about creativity, which is an interesting conclusion in itself.

Philosophical aesthetics was flourishing in the Anglo-American tradition when I started my first job, in 1991. I remember many of those involved in this book from when they were graduate students. It is a testament to the strength of the area that so many of them have found a place in the profession and are doing such excellent work.