New Waves in Ethics

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Thom Brooks (ed.), New Waves in Ethics, Palgrave Macmillan, 2011, 294pp., $30.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780230232761.

Reviewed by David G. Dick, University of Calgary


Thom Brooks lists two goals for this new anthology. First, he hopes that "anyone coming to the study of ethics for the first time should be able to pick up this book, read its pages and become knowledgeable about major debates in [ethics]." (p. 1) Second, the collection is intended to offer a "snapshot of the leading upcoming figures" which we might later "use to chart the future direction of their thought." (p. 1) While such judgments of who is a leading and upcoming figure can be notoriously difficult to make (and Brooks is careful to include a list of those he regrets could not be included, p.5 n.3), he has gathered an impressive collection of thirteen new essays, whose quality is remarkably high and consistent, particularly for a collection of all original and invited work.

Only in time will we be able to judge if Brooks has achieved his second goal, but his first goal has been admirably met. No doubt due to some editorial influence on his part, nearly every essay begins with a detailed summary of recent thinking surrounding an issue, and this makes each essay a nice, brief primer on a topic before the author advances the dialectic another step. Where the questions were familiar to me, as in Danielle Bromich's essay on motivational internalism, the picture of the current state of the topic was beyond reproach. In cases where the issues were unfamiliar to me, as in Brooks's own essay on the British Idealists's views on punishment, the opening summary was accessible and informative.

For those having some basic familiarity with philosophy, each essay provides enough background for even those entirely ignorant of the work being done in the area. Averaging about 20 pages each, the essays would be appropriate for everyone from a mid-career philosophy undergraduate on up. Some chapters are better than others (though precisely which will no doubt be a matter of the reader's own philosophical temperament and taste), but none of the essays fail to justify the time spent reading them. This is quite an accomplishment for any anthology.

Reading an anthology like this cover to cover is probably far less common than simply harvesting some relevant essays from it, but those who read it in its entirety will be struck by the diversity of topics that are today brought together under the title "philosophical ethics." The essays engage metaethical questions including the appropriateness of emotions like regret (Kahn), normative questions such as the adequacy of hypothetical contractualism (Øverland), and applied issues such as what to do when the recipients of aid have different conceptions of the good from those giving it (Fuller). The very wide range of what ethicists work on today is reflected well by this collection that includes the mathematical sophistication of Iwao Hirose's argument that egalitarians may not be vulnerable to a leveling-down objection alongside the unflinching attention to the (horrifying) details of rape as a weapon of war in Mari Mikkola's argument that the badness of rape cannot be understood only in terms of using a person as an object.

Despite these vastly disparate topics, at least one pattern emerges across these thirteen essays: the appeal to empirical data, particularly from psychology, in shaping or anchoring an argument. Though all the essays could have been written from an armchair, they build on knowledge that is to be found only in the lab or the field. More than half of the essays make such data central to their arguments. Mikkola's essay "Dehumanization" draws on fieldwork done with victims of martial rape to show that some instances of rape do not fail to account for the humanity of their victims, but are instead deliberately calculated to injure it. Lisa Fuller's essay "Knowing Their Own Good" is built around careful attention to the actual preferences and circumstances of aid recipients, just as Nicole Hassoun's "Making Free Trade Fair" employs data about the impact actual Fair Trade policies and programs have had.

By far, the empirical science most heavily represented is psychology. Results from psychological research are central to the essays of Bromwich, Miller, Liao, and Webber.

Danielle Bromwich's defense of motivational internalism turns partially on an appeal to scientific claims about mental illnesses such as psychopathy and depression. Motivational internalism is the view that sincere moral judgments always result in the relevant moral motivations. The view faces obstacles when it comes to commonplace counterexamples such as someone judging she ought to give to charity, but simply too depressed to do anything about it. Citing the DSM-IV and other research on clinical depression, Bromwich notes that depression typically involves cognitive impairment, as well as motivational deficiencies. If depression does impair our judgments, these apparent counterexamples disappear. They are simply instances of less than sincere judgments, which motivational internalism would not expect to result in motivation.

Pointing this out is unlikely to sway a committed externalist, since adding cognitive impairment to our understanding of depression does not remove the possibility that it is still a motivational defect doing the work. It does, however, complicate things for externalists who wish to appeal to such cases.

It is telling though that Bromwich, who intends to show "that the central organizing problem of meta-ethics -- the moral problem -- is based on a misconception of the nature of belief" (p. 82), lets her case be "predicated on the assumption that the scientific literature on amoralism and apathy will undermine the motivational externalist's challenge" (p. 85 n. 18) What began as an investigation of conceptual relationships ends up as an empirical question.

Nowhere in the volume is the use of psychological research more encyclopedic or promising than in Christian Miller's "Guilt, Embarrassment, and the Existence of Character Traits." Its discussion and bibliography could simply be assigned as an introduction to the last 50 years of work on the moral emotions and the influence of situations on moral behavior. Drawing on this wealth of research in social psychology, Miller aims to carve out a position between, and distinct from, the eliminativists who wish to explain away character traits and the Aristotelians who wish to insist on "global character traits such as compassion and honesty." (p. 150) Miller's focus is on what he calls "global helping traits," which appear to influence moral behavior in remarkably stable and predictable ways. For example, if you make a person feel guilty about her involvement in a camera malfunction, she will be far more likely to later help someone with a torn grocery bag. (p. 160)

Interesting as these results are, the data do not yet establish the existence of character traits in particular individuals, contrary to what Miller's title implies. The cases Miller marshals to establish these "global helping traits" are remarkably consistent across times and situations, but the data simply does not yet speak to the existence of character traits that persist over time in particular individuals. It seems that we do know that everyone is more likely to help out when feeling guilty, but we still have no idea if someone who is honest at home will carry that trait over to being honest in the workplace. Miller himself finally admits this in his sixty-seventh footnote, saying

what we do not have is a number of longitudinal studies focused on the same individuals. . . . So we can only speculate at this point that the same helping trends we see across subjects involved in the same experiment will also apply with the same subjects over time. (p. 182 n. 67)

What Miller's paper suggests is that there is still much more fruitful research to be done in collaboration between moral philosophers and empirical psychologists. As S. Matthew Liao ("Bias and Reasoning: Haidt's Theory of Moral Judgment") points out, such collaborations might come from some fairly unlikely corners.

To some, Jonathan Haidt's work on moral judgments appears to undermine both moral judgments and the philosophy devoted to them, showing moral reasoning to be nothing more than rationalization after the fact. Haidt's work indicates that moral judgments are actually intuitions, made by the quick and effortless mechanism psychologists label "System 1." Instead of driving us to act, the slow and labored moral judgments we reason to using "System 2" are nothing more than biased spokesmen, devoted to justifying whichever conclusion intuition delivers to them. Haidt and others go on to show that our moral judgments are further biased to agree with those of our friends and to cohere with our identities.

After rejecting two other accounts of bias as inadequate, Liao argues that we ought to conceive of bias as a lack of epistemic justification, instead of just deviation from expert-endorsed rules or from "unwanted" influences. If we understand bias to be a lack of epistemic justification, we can see that Haidt's results need not amount to a debunking of moral judgments. These influences on moral judgments can be epistemically warranted, and so Haidt's results need cast no doubt on the legitimacy of those judgments. For example, some tendencies to agree with our friends might undermine our epistemic justification in some cases, but if we believe that our friends make trustworthy judgments, it could be epistemically rational to move our differing judgments closer to theirs (p. 118) In addition to his promising account of how to think about bias, Liao shows that even apparently hostile results from social psychology can be reconciled into a constructive relationship with moral philosophy.

In what is probably the most readable essay of the collection, Jonathan Webber makes an explicit appeal for moral philosophy to be done with more careful attention to facts about human psychology. In "Climate Change and Public Moral Reasoning," Webber says himself that "the idea is that one proper task of moral philosophy is to view contemporary ethical issues through the lens of current empirical psychology." (p. 293) In particular, Webber draws a distinction between "surface human desires" and the "deeper desires and values" that give rise to them. While the deeper desires may be hard-wired and unchangeable, the surface desires are historical and contingent. Research into which desires are deep and irrevocable and which are surface and changeable might yield some surprising options for moral behavior. Taking climate change as his example, Webber points out we might reduce our emissions not through an austerity that thwarts our deepest desires, but through changes that might even make our lives more pleasant. For example, as George Monbiot suggests, there may be "massive energy savings" to be had if we simply replaced our current slog back and forth to the supermarket in our cars with a delivery system that came right to our doors." (p. 287) Whatever your opinions of these particular suggestions, it is hard to deny the appeal of this "applied moral psychology" that could open up vast new possibilities for both new moral philosophy and new moral actions.

Because it offers a simple, powerful, and provocative idea, Webber's essay stands with my other favorite in the volume, Chrisoula Andreou's "Choosing Well: Value Pluralism and Patterns of Choice." Andreou offers a simple and elegant solution for making the notoriously intractable problem of incomparable values tractable.

Famously value monists, like some utilitarians, face no such problem since their position permits them to make all values commensurable, measuring the values of everything against one another in a single currency. Just as with currencies, value pluralism faces no difficulty if the plural values can be judged in terms of one another: dollars and pounds can easily coexist on your balance sheet so long as you know the exchange rate between them. But if you want to resist the conclusion that there is a legitimate exchange rate that holds between your morning doughnuts and your daughter, you might be forced to adopt a plurality of values that are different in kind. This will allow you to insist that there is literally no number of doughnuts that could be an adequate replacement for your daughter, but it leaves you in a tighter spot when values are genuinely incomparable.

Though their respective worths probably can't be reconciled to a single scale, your daughter (I hope) will always trump your doughnuts, and so these values aren't really incomparable after all. What to do, then, if you are faced with a decision where there simply is no overriding value?

This decision might be as simple as deciding what to have for lunch. In Andreou's example, suppose you value your health, pleasure, and wealth and need your lunch to reflect these values. Plausibly, no lunch accommodates all three, nor can the values be weighed against each other, so how can reason tell us what is best to do when there simply is no uniquely best value to respect?

Who knew that choosing lunch could be so stressful? Even this simple choice reveals the terrifying prospect that there might be problems beyond the capacity of reason to solve. How could we ever rationally choose among differing values that are all legitimate but cannot be compared? As Andreou puts it, "Doing justice to a plurality of values is not the sort of thing that can normally be achieved in one decision; but sometimes it can be achieved over a set of decisions" (p. 54) Andreou's solution to this very hard problem is: deliberately constructed patterns of choice can appropriately respond to a plurality of incomparable values. Even if no single lunch can simultaneously respect the values of health, pleasure, and wealth, a pattern of lunches can. Reason may be incapable of reconciling this incomparability in a single choice, but it can construct a pattern of choices that amounts to a reconciliation by appropriately acknowledging and respecting these values at different times.

Obviously, there will be limitations to how far this approach can extend. The example values Andreou chooses are all forgiving since they do not demand constant attention or adherence for appropriate respect. Consider instead the plausibly unforgiving moral values of honesty and non-maleficence, both of which demand constant adherence. A plan to refrain from lying except on Tuesdays fails to respect the value of honesty just as much as a plan to refrain from doing harm except on Thursdays fails to respect the value of non-maleficence.

Acknowledging this, Andreou's solution still promises interesting applications to matters far more pressing than lunch. Deciding on the appropriate pattern of actions just might be the right strategy for reconciling the otherwise irreconcilable values in our private lives and political institutions. Even if the applications of Andreou's solution remain fairly modest, what it shows is that reason is not, after all, helpless before incomparable values.

That conclusion, like this collection, is well worth our time and attention.