New Waves in Philosophy of Religion

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Yujin Nagasawa and Erik J. Wielenberg (eds.), New Waves in Philosophy of Religion, Palgrave Macmillan, 2009, 219pp., $32.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780230223851.

Reviewed by Kelly James Clark, Calvin College



This is a collection in Palgrave’s “New Waves in Philosophy” series, which is intended to bring together essays by the best of the new generation of philosophers. There are likely to be disputes about which new philosophers are the best (but if, as chapter 2 defends, God need not create the best, then the editors may be relieved of this burden as well), which topics are the current rage, and whether or not these philosophers are really new (one contributor, for example, is approaching fifty and has a surprising amount of gray hair). Furthermore, every reviewer is likely to say how he or she would have written such a book. I’ll refrain from making any such comments or criticisms save one at the end of the review.

While the philosophers may be new, it’s not entirely clear that the waves are. There is a lot of that good old time Western philosophy of religion here: same old topics, but new, decidedly more technical, approaches. Consider the authors and titles: Daniel Hill, “A New Definition of Omnipotence in Terms of Sets”; Klaas Kraay, “Can God Choose the World at Random”; T. J. Mawson, “Why Is There Anything at All”; Alexander Pruss, “Programs, Bugs, DNA and a Design Argument”; Neil Manson, “The ‘Why Design?’ Question”; David Efird, “Divine Command Theory and the Semantics of Quantified Modal Logic”; Christian Miller, “Divine Desire Theory and Obligation”; Daniel Howard-Snyder, “The Puzzle of Prayers of Thanksgiving and Praise”; Tim Bayne and Greg Restall, “A Participatory Model of the Atonement”; Christopher Eberle, “Basic Human Worth: Religious and Secular Perspectives”; and Thaddeus Metz, “Imperfection as Sufficient for a Meaningful Life: How Much Is Enough?” Perhaps if God is immutable, and in this book we find mostly philosophy of God, we might not expect topical revolutions.

Daniel Hill explicates the concept of omnipotence in terms of sets rather than in terms of traditional but disputed entities such as states of affairs, propositions and actions. Instead of explaining why propositions are disputed, he discusses problems with sentences. If omnipotence is God’s power to make every sentence true, sentences must capture everything that can possibly be true. Hill rejects sentences as a means to explicate omnipotence because while sentences are finite, omnipotence requires tasks that “need infinite specification”. Furthermore, if sentences are nothing but physical marks, they would prove insufficient to represent every truth in the mental world one might think is within the domain of omnipotence. If sentences are God’s mental representations, however, then the concept of a sentence presumes that God exists, which Hill himself chooses not to presume. This sort of criticism of sentences might be likewise applied to Hill’s preferred entities, sets. Although Hill claims that it is relatively clear what sets are (collections), without God sets prove equally problematic. If finite sentences can’t specify infinity, can collections? Or, to put this another way, don’t we need sentences to specify sets, even infinite sets (say the set of successors)? Yet if it’s possible to specify sets with finite instruction, can’t we do with sentences what Hill wants to do with sets? Furthermore, if sets are collections, perhaps, as Cantor believed, infinite sets require an infinite collector (God). Hence, sets may be as God-dependent, and so as problematic, as sentences. Nevertheless if the best way to conceive of omnipotence is in terms of sets, Hill’s essay is a powerful piece of conceptual analysis that tries to capture with sets and possible beings the various traditional twists and turns for understanding ‘omnipotence’.

If theists reject Leibniz’s claim that there is a best of all possible worlds, they are left with a dilemma. How can they explain how God could rationally select a world to actualize among either equally preferable or progressively greater worlds? If, under these conditions, God were to select a world to actualize, God’s choice would be arbitrary or random and, therefore, not rational. Even if one thinks God can make a random choice, there seem to be many equally good randomizers and so no reason to prefer one of them to any other. Kraay plausibly rejects several proposals for God’s preference of randomizers and concludes that there are no defensible randomizing processes available to God. If the non-Leibnizian theist wishes to coherently maintain theistic beliefs, Kraay contends that the theist must offer a more compelling account of God’s world-choosing activity.

Pruss defends the analogy between DNA and a computer program (and, hence, defends the conclusion that DNA has a designer) by developing and extending the normative characteristics of the analogues. He argues that just as the concept of bugs requires a normative standard for its evaluation, so too genetic defects require objective normative standards for their evaluation. If there are such normative standards, the analogy between DNA and computer programs is such that we have reason to believe that our DNA is designed by an intelligent agent. While some might find Pruss’s discussion of genetic defects rather hasty, cavalier and offputting, he has shown at the least prima facie plausibility of an analogy between DNA and computer programs.

Bayesian versions of the argument from design face the “Why Design?” question. The hypothesis of a designer can only raise the probability of, or make more likely, an allegedly designed universe (given general background knowledge) if one has some access to the designer’s preferences. After chiding philosophers and scientists for their slight answers to the question, Manson offers little more than a suggestion that we look instead to Norman Kretzmann’s and Robert Adams’ more theological answers (why didn’t he do that himself in this article?).

Efird offers a modal reconstruction of the divine command theory of ethics (DCT). One might wonder why the DCT needed such a formalization but Efird shows the various commitments and assumptions that versions of DCT require. Seeking to avoid Hume’s Razor (“Do not multiply necessities beyond necessity”), Moore’s Razor (“Do not contradict common sense beyond necessity”) and Quine’s Razor (“Do not complicate theory beyond necessity”), Efird’s preferred version of DCT wins in a close shave. His modalized version, relying on Priorian semantics, is not unlike Robert Adams’ DCT which assumes that God is loving. Although the Euthyphro problem is curiously never mentioned, especially given such concern for metaphysical issues, Efird’s modalized but modified Adams DCT would clearly avoid the arbitrariness problem. Some may balk, however, at the claim that satisfying the above razors requires a DCT in which God exists contingently, God is contingently loving, and God’s commands are contingent. Perhaps there should have been some religious razors as well.

Let me proceed more quickly through the remainder of the essays. If DCT is not your cup of tea, Miller offers an alternative — Divine Desire Theory (DDT) which grounds obligation/forbiddenness/etc. not in God’s commands or intentions but in God’s desires. Miller’s essay offers a tantalizing peek, no doubt a summary of a book-length project, at DDT. How can we thank a God who is constrained by his nature to do the best? If he couldn’t have done otherwise, in what sense are his actions praiseworthy? Howard-Snyder’s incompatibilist intuitions preclude him from accepting standard compatibilist resolutions of these matters; the only way out may be to surrender God’s essential unsurpassable goodness (with God somehow meritoriously choosing to be unsurpassably good). Bayne and Restall reject standard models of the atonement on the grounds that they construe sin solely deontically, in terms of the failure to fulfill moral obligation. Since sin affects our nature, debt-payment or Christ-as-example theories ignore the need for reorientation. They defend, partly on biblical grounds, a participatory model of the atonement in which we die to the old self by participating in Jesus’ death and are born to a new self by participating in the resurrection of Jesus. Eberle canvasses various secular accounts of the grounding of human worth — reason, moral capacities, etc. — and finds them wanting. He argues that human worth is grounded in God’s loving each human being and none more than another other. Finally, Metz discusses naturalist conceptions of the meaning of life that reject the supernaturalist’s claim that a meaningful life requires a standard of perfection. He rejects various imperfection theses before defending his own view: a life is meaningful if it doesn’t fall too far below the maximal value that human beings can achieve.

Let me conclude with a few observations and then a criticism. In England a book of this sort might be titled “Philosophical Theology”; this would prove a more apt title. This is easy to see in discussions of omnipotence and divine command theories and even more so in those about prayer, human worth, and the atonement. Some of the discussants commend appeals to theology, and the theology in question is broadly Western and theistic and, in some cases, specifically Christian. Hence, there’s little philosophy of religion in this book and more philosophy of God (even the God of Abraham, Isaac and Jacob). This is just an observation. Recent Western philosophy of religion at its best has been done, by and large, by Christian philosophers (with some notable exceptions) and the best of recent Western theology has been done by philosophers (I can’t think of any notable exceptions here). I suspect, though, that non-Westerners and theologians will be put off by the thoroughly analytic and abstract character of these essays (Eberle’s, and Bayne and Restall’s essays are more inviting to the non-philosopher).

Nevertheless, and here comes the criticism, I wish the book had more by way of cultural engagement and even criticism. Except for Eberle’s critique of secular accounts of human worth and Metz’s engagement with and even defense of a naturalistic conception of a meaningful life, the essays seem intermural and the issues scholastic. With the rise of the so-called “New Atheists”, however, some New Theists need to stand up to these cultural broadsides. In particular, I wish it had engaged the recent developments in the cognitive and evolutionary psychology of religion. Some proponents of these views contend that their natural explanations of religious belief have explained God away. Dawkins’ The God Delusion and Dennett’s Breaking the Spell are perhaps the most notable contributions in this regard. While Dawkins’ book may contain poor philosophy and Dennett’s may be excessively self-congratulatory and badly in need of an editor, they have sold a lot of copies and engaged certain issues that demand a response. Naturalistic explanations of religion may prove to be to this generation what the deductive argument from evil was to previous generations. The new generation may need to strive harder for cultural relevance; I suggest they strive as hard for that as they do so admirably for logical rigor.

I’ll stop indulging now in how I might have edited this volume. The book as it stands contains, as the editors intended, fine contributions to Western philosophy/theology “by some of the best philosophers of religion of the new generation”.