New Waves in Philosophy of Technology

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Jan Kyrre Berg Olson, Evan Selinger, and Søren Riis (eds.), New Waves in Philosophy of Technology, Palgrave Macmillan, 2009, 322pp., $32.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780230220003.

Reviewed by William Rehg, Saint Louis University


In assembling the contributions to this volume, the editors hope to provide a sense of recent trends in the philosophy of technology. In his helpful Foreword, Don Ihde puts the essays in context by distinguishing three twentieth-century "waves" of philosophers of technology. Thinkers in the first wave, such as Martin Heidegger, tended to treat modern technology as a single reality, which possibly posed a metaphysical or cultural threat. The second wave consisted primarily of critical social theorists like Herbert Marcuse and other members of the Frankfurt School, who linked technology with capitalist society. The third wave encompasses Ihde's generation of philosophers: Albert Borgmann, Andrew Feenberg, and others. Third-wave philosophers tend to develop their views of technology with an eye to democratic theory, along pragmatic lines informed by phenomenological, historical, and social-political research. The book's title refers to a fourth wave. Judging from the sample of papers in this collection, fourth-wave thinkers address a wide range of concerns, which the editors group into four parts: history of philosophy and technology (two chapters), epistemic and metaphysical issues (five chapters), ethical and political issues (four chapters), and comparative philosophy of technology (two chapters).

The editors also assume that "the long-standing divide between analytic and continental philosophy needs to be overcome" (1). Here the volume comes up short, for the contributions are heavily dominated by continental approaches. Of the fifteen contributors, six work on the European continent and six others, mainly situated in the United States, draw heavily on continental thinkers such as Heidegger, Ricoeur, Habermas, Foucault, and Latour. None of the essays struck me as particularly analytic in style, as compared to The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy entry on philosophy of technology, which takes an explicitly analytic approach.[1]

Nonetheless, the diversity and complexity of the contributions is impressive. Given constraints of space, I can provide only the barest description of most of the chapters. There are, however, two trends in the collection that deserve attention: four chapters reflect the influence of "postphenomenological" philosophy of technology, and a number of essays focus on how to do philosophy of technology today. I thus begin with these essays, and then turn to the remaining chapters.

To understand postphenomenology as a method, the reader does best to start with Robert Rosenberger's essay in Part II, which presents postphenomenology as a potential contributor to contemporary scientific debates that involve imaging techniques. Developed by Don Ihde (among others), postphenomenology draws on phenomenological methods of close description, yet follows pragmatists in eschewing foundationalism. A postphenomenological analysis aims to show how human experience is mediated by technologies of different sorts. Going on the assumption that scientific images are "multi-stable", or open to alternative plausible interpretations, one employs a descriptive analysis that identifies the different stable "variations" in the possible relationships that link persons, technology, and world. One is then in a position to articulate the ways that imaging technologies underwrite competing interpretations in virtue of spatiotemporal "transformations" that take place through imaging procedures (e.g., reframing the object, rendering it two-dimensional, slowing it down). To illustrate the method, Rosenberger brings a postphenomenological analysis to bear on a debate in neurobiology over the mechanisms for releasing neurotransmitters in the brain.

Postphenomenology further proves its merits in two chapters about how to do philosophy of technology today. The first of these chapters appears in Part III and bears on an ethics of technology. Here Peter-Paul Verbeek's postphenomenological approach (chap. 11) comes off better than Benjamin Hale's attempt to expand Habermas's discourse ethics (chap. 10). Hale expands moral discourse to include consideration of the needs and interests of all natural entities, human or not, by moral agents. He has an important goal in view: the ecologically-minded idea that all of nature counts as a source of moral considerations that potentially bear on acceptable courses of action. He goes too far, however, when he claims that every possible fact about nature, even the most trivial such as "the number of hairs on Pedro Almodóvar's head", counts as a prima facie consideration for moral discourse (226). This view of discourse appears unnecessarily demanding, even as an idealization. Moreover, Hale draws the line at technological artifacts, insisting that they do not generate new moral considerations once they exist. The reason, he claims, is that an artifact "is already the product of careful consideration" (227). Even if true, this reason strikes me as a dubious basis for Hale's boundary between the moral statuses of nature and artifacts, and his shaky attempts to ward off numerous objections did not assuage my doubts. Verbeek's approach thus appears more promising, for it assumes that humans and non-humans, artifacts included, are "intricately connected" in moral practices (253). Rather than start with the modern ideal of an autonomous moral subject standing over against non-human objects, Verbeek points out that human agents are "constituted as technologically mediated subjects" (259). He thus proposes a framework that involves three kinds of agents: the human designer of technology, the user who interprets and appropriates that technology, and the artifact itself, which mediates and shapes human moral agency, often in ways not envisioned by the designer. For example, the development of obstetric ultrasound technologies and prenatal screening has affected the interpretation of pregnancy and confronted parents with new moral questions. An ethics of technology, therefore, focuses above all on design, with an eye to such prospective technological mediations. Verbeek's approach, it seems to me, does not exclude discourse, but neither does it require Hale's overly instrumental view of artifacts.

Evan Selinger's contribution in Part IV shows how postphenomenology can inform the critical analysis of technology transfer, a phenomenon he argues is a central -- but philosophically neglected -- aspect of globalization. Like Rosenberger, he focuses on a concrete case study: the use of microcredit, administered by the Grameen Bank, to support the Village Phone Program (VP) in Bangladesh. Relying on quantitative sociological studies, backers of the VP-program made a number of bold claims about its role in empowering impoverished women (the "phone ladies"). However, micro-sociological research has subsequently raised severe doubts about the program and challenged the optimistic view as ideological: rather than empower women, the VP-program merely reinforces the traditional patriarchal culture. Selinger shows how a postphenomenological analysis takes this debate a step further by undermining the empowerment-disempowerment dichotomy. Rather, programs like VP are ambiguous, instilling "simultaneous relations of independence and dependence" (288, emphasis removed).

In a broad sense, all of the essays in this volume point to ways of doing philosophy of technology today, but some of the contributors make this point more explicitly than others, and some make the claim more radically than most. Selinger, for example, maintains that technology transfer ought to be a central concern for philosophers of technology. Hale and Verbeek both attempt to reshape the modern conceptual landscape of moral theory. David M. Kaplan's contribution (chap. 4) also deserves mention here. Kaplan believes that third-wave critical theories of technology (e.g., Feenberg's) lack adequate grounds for critique; he thus advocates a "critical-narrative philosophy of technology" informed by Paul Ricoeur's hermeneutics. The other chapter in this vein -- coauthored by Caspar Bruun Jensen and Christopher Gad -- follows Selinger's contribution in Part IV. Similar to the postphenomenologists, Jensen and Gad draw on Ihde's approach, albeit with critical reservations. More than any of the other contributors, Jensen and Gad advocate a closer relationship between philosophers and contextualist STS (science and technology studies). The result, they maintain, is an "empirical philosophy" of technology that picks up the contextualist sensibilities of STS, but with a philosophical eye for cross-context linkages, above all for the transfers of conceptions of technology across cultural contexts. Like STS, empirical philosophy focuses above all on particular cases that display the fluidity, ambivalence, and systemic character of the local use of specific technologies. Jensen and Gad develop this idea with three case studies.

Of the remaining chapters in Parts I and II, most focus on particular questions and thinkers in the history of the philosophy of technology. Part I contains two ambitious, historically-oriented chapters. Keekok Lee (chap. 1) attempts to integrate the entire history of technology in a broad conceptual framework that does justice to ancient and modern technology and the philosophies of science that accompanied them. In a densely-argued chapter in which clocks play a leading role, Jan Kyrre Berg Olsen (chap. 2) moves from ancient Greek conceptions of time to relativity physics, in order to analyze the relationship between the human experience of time and the natural time of relativity physics.

In Part II, three contributors take more or less critical views of Heidegger. The most critical is Graham Harman (chap. 5), who maintains that Marshall and Eric McLuhan provide a superior (and more optimistic) framework than Heidegger's for thinking about technology today. Like Heidegger, the McLuhans make the bold claim that all entities, understood as media "transmitting the energies and broadcasts of others", involve a fourfold metaphysical structure (101). However, where Heidegger proposed earth, sky, gods, and mortals, the McLuhans' "tetrad" consists of enhancement (all technology amplifies a human faculty), obsolescence (intensifying one area of experience diminishes another), reversal (a form pushed to its limits becomes its opposite), and retrieval (any medium contains an older medium). Although Harman's contribution provides a compact introduction to the McLuhans' thought, such a sweeping proposal inevitably raises more questions than a single chapter can answer. The chapters by Søren Riis (chap. 6) and Iain Thomson (chap. 7) both provide rather interesting critical readings of Heidegger. Riis argues that the later Heidegger's notion of thinking ends up in a dead end: a thinking of nothing at all, thought without an object. Riis thus turns to Heidegger's analysis of art as a more promising model for thinking, understood now as a circle in which thinking and its object emerge simultaneously. Thomson's clearly-written essay tackles Heidegger's difficult thought of technology as both "danger" and "saving promise". The key to understanding Heidegger on this point, Thomson suggests, is the kind of insight one has in accomplishing a gestalt switch: one sees in technology the promise instead of the danger -- the very insight that is crucial to overcoming the danger.

In Part III, Philip Brey (chap. 8) lays out some of the conceptual distinctions at issue in human enhancement technologies (HETs). Specifically, he distinguishes different types of enhancement, different aspects of personal identity that are affected by HETs, and the possible social-political consequences of different HETs. Brey's chapter thus provides a useful framework for sorting out questions that already confront us today. Nick Bostrom (chap. 9) makes a boldly forward-looking case for technology forecasting based on the "Technological Completion Conjecture" (TCC): "If scientific and technological development efforts do not effectively cease, then all important basic capabilities that could be obtained through some possible technology will be obtained" (190). TCC comes with two important conditions. First, it holds only on the proviso that development is not permanently interrupted, say by ecological collapse. Second, TCC refers only to "basic capabilities", thus to broad developments (e.g., increasingly efficient means of transportation), but not to any predictions about particular technological artifacts that deliver those capabilities (e.g., steam- versus diesel-based forms of transportation). Bostrom's form of technological forecasting thus avoids the problems that plague forecasting models that focus on specific short-term predictions. Rather, he examines long-run directional scenarios, arguing that one of the more likely scenarios is a posthuman condition in which the earth sustains a population of over one trillion persons who enjoy a half-millennium average lifespan, are relatively free of suffering, and are two-standard deviations smarter than today's humans.

Although the quality and accessibility of the essays is somewhat uneven, New Waves in Philosophy of Technology does succeed in giving the reader a sense of the different approaches and concerns among younger philosophers of technology working primarily in continental traditions, and the bibliographies provide useful leads to further reading.

[1] Maarten Franssen, Gert-Jan Lokhorst, and Ibo van de Poel, "Philosophy of Technology," The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Spring 2009 Edition), ed. E. N. Zalta. Retrieved May 28, 2009, from