New Waves in Truth

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Cory D. Wright and Nikolaj J.L.L. Pedersen (eds.), New Waves in Truth, Palgrave Macmillan, 2010, 319pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780230229983.

Reviewed by Andreas Stokke, CSMN, University of Oslo


New Waves in Truth (henceforth, NWT) is an anthology of eighteen essays published in 2010 by Palgrave Macmillan as part of the New Waves in Philosophy series, edited by Vincent F. Hendricks and Duncan Pritchard. The essays are divided into six sections:

· Deflationism and Beyond

· Ascription, Attribution, Predication

· Truth Values

· The Value of Truth

· Realism and Correspondence

· Kinds of Truth and Truth-apt Discourse

The volume is an ambitious attempt to survey the field of current work on truth as it relates to a variety of topics. The essays in this collection are all quite short, averaging roughly fifteen pages each. Partly for this reason, and due to the breadth of the range of the themes of the essays, NWT lives up to the explicit aim of the New Waves in Philosophy series, which the series editors describe as that of providing "a snapshot of cutting-edge research that will be of vital interest to researchers and students working in all subject areas of philosophy." (NWT, ix)

NWT may thus be recommended as an excellent primer for anyone looking to get an overview of current work on issues concerning truth in areas including norms of belief, relativism, color, truth-making, critical reflection, autonomy, as well more traditional themes such as paradoxes, deflationism, coherence, correspondence, pluralism, and the status of bivalence. On the other hand, readers hoping for definitive treatments and detailed argumentation may be disappointed. The relative brevity of the contributions, and their thematic diversity, make NWT appear more as a potential quarry for ideas rather than a collection of cornerstones for the future of the field.

This is not to say, of course, that these essays do not contain interesting analyses and novel insights; it is just to emphasize how the purpose of the volume shapes its content. It remains true that NWT is an impressive collection of essays of high quality.

In their introduction, entitled 'Truth: The New Wave', the editors describe the area of research on the subject of truth as having gradually stagnated since an eruption, beginning in the late 1980s, of groundbreaking work by authoritative figures such as Ralph Walker, Cheryl Misak, Dorothy Grover, Paul Horwich, Marian David, Crispin Wright, Anil Gupta, and Nuel Belnap. They write,

while truth continues to be of focal interest, it seems that there have been remarkably fewer new directions since then… . many of the questions, problems, and solutions have become concretized, and thus many of the debates have become entrenched. (1)

Accordingly, it is the aim of NWT to present new work by non-senior researchers who are "beginning to reset that agenda." (2) So it seems like a good question to ask how these 'new waves' in research about truth relate to the more traditional debates, if at all.

One potential source of surprise for anyone reading NWT from this perspective is the extensive role played by deflationism in many of the essays.

In 1999, at the conclusion of the period that Wright and Pedersen describe in the passage quoted above -- and with respect to which they see the work represented in NWT as setting a new agenda -- another anthology of essays on truth was published, edited by Simon Blackburn and Keith Simmons.[1] Blackburn and Simmons's collection opens with historical essays by Bradley, James, Russell, Frege, and others, and ends with more contemporary contributions, all of which are now classics, by Gupta, Wright, Horwich, Field, and more. It thereby presents a vista of the development of research on truth from its modern origins to the end of Wright and Pedersen's bygone area.

As Blackburn and Simmons explain in their useful introduction, the modern philosophical debate on truth (in the analytic tradition) began as a reaction against the correspondence theoretic approach that had largely dominated the study of the topic, arguably as far back as Aristotle's Metaphysics.[2] There were broadly three reactions: coherence theories, pragmatism, and deflationism, also sometimes called minimalism. And as is clear from Blackburn and Simmons's selection of essays, the main contender in the modern debate, the one approach that emerged as the demonized and glorified protagonist, was deflationism.

A large part of the debate has concerned how to formulate the view, or what precisely a deflationist should claim. This trend continues in NWT. Three of its essays explicitly concern the question of what deflationism should be taken to be. Nic Damnjanovic proposes a new conception of deflationism grounded in conceptual analysis. Bradley Armour-Garb and James A. Woodbridge argue that deflationists should be pretense-theorists, akin to familiar approaches to scientific and mathematical discourse associated with the work of Stephen Yablo and Hartry Field. And Matti Eklund suggests that deflationists should claim less than they are sometimes taken to do.

In addition, at least three other essays are engaged in direct debates with deflationism, rather than in defining the view. Douglas Patterson rejects standard deflationism, as he conceives of it, but retains a view according to which our intuitive concept of truth is circular. John Collins presents an argument based on domain restriction of natural language quantifiers against the stock deflationist claim that 'true' is a device for compendious assertion. Patrick Greenough argues that deflationism is incompatible with the acceptance of truth-value gaps, that is, with the rejection of bivalence.

In other words, at least one third of the essays in NWT are directly essays on the topic of deflationism, and the topic is central to many others. One may ask, then, to what extent the waves presented in NWT genuinely constitute a release from entrenchment.

It is beyond the scope of this review to examine in detail the different perspectives on deflationism offered by the contributions to NWT. Still, it may be useful to attempt to tentatively answer this question.

First, at least the essays by Damnjanovic, Armour-Garb and Woodbridge, and Eklund partly attempt to climb up from the fosse in proposing new conceptions of deflationism. In particular, we should mention the contributions by Damnjanovic and by Armour-Garb and Woodbridge as presenting creative, novel ways of looking at an old debate. Comparatively, Eklund's essay has less novelty value in its aim to emphasize that a traditional deflationist claim -- that the sole motivation for resorting to truth predicates is their expressive power -- is capable of standing alone and thereby carving out a position that may prove sturdier than more profuse kinds of deflationism.

Second, similarly to Eklund's, the essays by Patterson, Collins, and Greenough represent a more traditional tendency, and thereby in some sense fail to surf newer waves. Patterson is concerned with defending a position, or at least a version of it, forged in the golden era, namely the minimalism championed by G.E. Moore and Donald Davidson. Greenough is engaged with a debate that is at least as old as Michael Dummett's 1973 'The Philosophical Basis of Intuitionistic Logic'.[3] And while Collins's argument is novel, it is still concerned with a traditional aspect of deflationism.

Emphatically, and to repeat, I am not claiming that these authors do not present fruitful and philosophically satisfying contributions. Rather, the point is that if the goal of the editors was to present contributions that are wholly 'new wave', perhaps a narrower selection of essays (thereby allowing for more pages for each) would have been more advantageous.

Turning to the essays in NWT that are not explicitly about deflationism (roughly two thirds), what can we say about how they relate to the old debate?

One can sort these contributions into two rough groups. On the one hand, some authors directly address the subject matter of truth, albeit from a different angle than has traditionally been at the forefront of debates over, e.g., deflationism. In this group one finds contributions by Gurpreet Rattan, Adam Kovach, and Chase B. Wrenn, that is, the essays in the section of NWT entitled 'The Value of Truth'. These essays to a large extent deserve the epithet 'new wave'.

To be sure, the questions that these authors address are at least as old as philosophy itself. These are questions like, 'Are beliefs subject to a norm of truth?', 'What grounds truth norms?', 'Is truth intrinsically valuable?', etc. But if traditional interests of that kind were sufficient to deny new wave status, the sea would always look calm. But while these themes have historical roots, they are to a lesser extent on the curriculum of the stagnating debate that Wright and Pedersen invoked in the introduction.

On the other hand, there are essays to which the subject of truth appears to be slightly peripheral. Among these are the contributions by Dan López de Sa, Berit Brogaard, and Gillian Russell. The extent to which these authors are concerned with truth appears to be more secondary and dependent on their main topic.

For example, the topic of López de Sa's article is truth-making for areas of discourse congenial to certain kinds of antirealism and relativism, i.e., talk about what is funny, tasty, sexy, etc. López de Sa's proposal is that these discourses are underpinned by truth-making provided by response-dependent properties. Brogaard's article is chiefly an essay in the semantics of color terms, although she explicitly relates these issues to questions concerning monadic vs. relative truth and similar topics. Yet, these issues mainly concern semantics, and do not in a strict sense pertain to the nature of truth. Similarly, Russell's goal is to present a novel argument against the thesis that necessity is grounded in analyticity. Hence, although all of these three essays do concern truth in some way or other, they appear more as contributions to philosophy of language, philosophy of mind, and metaphysics.

These authors present us with stimulating work on topics that are at the core of these fields, and their essays are certainly highly recommendable reading. But it is natural to feel that a volume like NWT would have been better served by omitting contributions that only indirectly target its designated topic. In philosophy, everything is connected to everything, so it is always easy to justify inclusions of this kind. And they are not without value. Yet, at least in my opinion, allowing more space for the articles that do tackle the subject of truth head on would have been preferable.

We may thus restate our warning: readers are less likely to find a selection of junior experts giving, as the series editors put it, "their view of the subject now and in the ten years to come" (NWT, ix) and more likely to find a compendium of diverse articles on matters both directly and indirectly related to truth.

Yet, all told, NWT deserves recommendation as stimulating, resourceful reading.

[1] Blackburn and Simmons (eds.): Truth, Oxford University Press, 1999.

[2] As discussed by Greenough in his 'Deflationism and Truth Value Gaps' (in NWT, p. 117), some (e.g., Williamson: Vagueness, Routledge, 1994, p. 190) see the famous Aristotelian dictum (Metaphysics G.7.25) as merely expressing the core intuition behind the familiar disquotational principles.

[3] Reprinted in his Truth and Other Enigmas, Duckworth, 1978.