Newton and Empiricism

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Zvi Biener and Eric Schliesser (eds.), Newton and Empiricism, Oxford University Press, 2014, 366pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199337095.

Reviewed by Katherine Brading, University of Notre Dame


This edited collection has its origins in the 2010 Pittsburgh Center for Philosophy of Science conference of the same title. It contains ten essays plus an introduction, and is divided into three sections, focusing on Newton's experimental method, his relationship to Locke and Hume, and the deployment and development of "Newtonian method" in the 18th, 19th, and 20th centuries. The volume provides new ways of thinking about Newton's contributions to philosophy for those familiar with early modern philosophy but not with Newton, and enriches and develops our understanding of Newton for those already familiar with some of Newton's own contributions to philosophy. It is a thoroughly enjoyable and rewarding read (and, I might add, the quality of the paper on which it is printed, the clarity of the typeface, and the absence of typos, all enhance the pleasure of reading the book).

The challenges thrown down by the book begin with its very title. "Empiricism" and "Rationalism" are controversial labels with which to approach philosophers of the seventeenth and eighteenth century, and the title of the book is deliberately provocative. I like it for that; it reminds us that what it means to be an empiricist, and our methods for mobilizing empirical resources in pursuit of our philosophical goals, are ongoing philosophical problems. They are problems to which Newton made dramatic, deep and lasting contributions, as the papers in this volume make vivid.

In their introduction, the editors point out that "explicating Newton's relation to 'empiricism' is not a matter of adding minutiae to a broadly well-known narrative, but of constructing the narrative itself" (p. 2). This is because there is no single tradition of "empiricism" in which we can situate Newton by means of "compare and contrast". Moreover, our understanding of Newton as a philosopher is currently undergoing rapid developments through ongoing efforts to situate him in philosophical context and read him as a philosopher in conversation with the other major philosophical figures of his time. These efforts build on the work of, especially, Betty-Jo Dobbs, J. E. McGuire, and Howard Stein, and this volume is a contribution to those efforts. The authors could have been more belligerent: the need for a newly constructed narrative has long been evident and is much overdue. While you won't find a new narrative in this volume (not surprisingly, it's an edited collection), plenty of useful resources towards such an enterprise are on display. Stephen Gaukroger's analysis of how the methodologies of Boyle and Newton differed from those of their contemporaries and immediate predecessors is typically insightful and incisive. Locke (e.g., Lisa Downing on metaphysics, Geoffrey Gorham and Edward Slowick on space and time) and Hume (e.g., Yoram Hazony on explanatory goals, Tamás Demeter on moral philosophy) feature prominently throughout the volume, but other figures receive significant attention, too. For example, Dana Jalobeanu attempts to dissolve some of the problems later scholars have had in reading Newton's paper on Light and Colors by placing it within a detailed account of the Baconian methodological tradition, itself currently undergoing a revival in our understanding of its sophistication. In a way, Gaukroger's discussion of Light and Colors picks up exactly where Jalobeanu's paper leaves off: with the question of how Newton can claim a degree of certainty for his conclusions going beyond that which Bacon and Hooke would have found acceptable. Gaukroger is right that the certainty Newton claimed did not concern underlying mechanisms, but I think there is more to it than this. Newton develops methodologies (both in experimenting and in theorizing) that produce results that support rich and quantified modal reasoning, as Philippe Hamou's splendid paper on Newton's Opticks and George Smith's paper on gravitational research after Newton's Principia (about which more below) make clear.

Methodology features prominently throughout, with a variety of aspects of Newton's methodology coming under examination. Hazony argues that Hume's attempted re-ordering and re-systematization of the sciences in the Treatise should be understood in the light of Newton's methodology of explanatory unification via his "analysis" and "synthesis". Newton's use of these terms is notoriously tricky to pin down but is central to understanding his methodology and its evolution (see also Ducheyne, 2012). Hazony offers an interpretation of Newton's second and third rules of reasoning in these terms, and argues for their centrality to Hume's project. Demeter's chapter on Newton and Hume also focuses on analysis and synthesis, this time in the context of the Opticks. Demeter argues for the importance of "Enlightenment vitalism" -- and in particular physiology and anatomy -- as a context for Hume's project. Moreover, although "Enlightenment vitalism" was inspired by the Opticks, Demeter argues against reading Hume as pursuing a "Newtonian" project in moral philosophy.

The experimental face of Newton's work, exemplified in the Opticks, contributed to the developing experimental tradition both in England and on the Continent. The first university to offer courses in experimental physics was Leiden (see Tammy Nyden's chapter), under the leadership of de Volder, a Cartesian professor of logic and physics, who was succeeded in this enterprise by the Newtonian 's Gravesande. The juxtaposition of Demeter's article on Hume alongside Nyden's piece on experiment forcefully brings home the point raised by the volume's title: what it means to be an empiricist was an evolving philosophical problem of the time. If de Volder as the instigator of experimental physics on the Continent seems puzzling initially, Nyden suggests that his experience of hands-on medical teaching practices in Leiden, including the anatomy theater, helps to dispel the puzzle, making it less surprising that he would have been struck by the pedagogical power of physics experiments when he visited England. Connections between medical practices and the rise of experimental physics deserve, and are beginning to receive, more investigation, as are the variety of ways in which "Newtonianism" permeated the life sciences and medicine in the early eighteenth century (see, for example, Charles Wolfe's chapter).

The last and crowning article is Smith's "Closing the Loop: Testing Newtonian Gravity, Then and Now". At over eighty pages, few journals or edited collections could or would have found space for it. It is to the editors' enormous credit that they published this important and rich article in its entirety. Those familiar with the work of Smith and Bill Harper (for Harper, see his 2011) will know that several decades of careful and detailed study of Newton's Principia and the methodology therein are now coming to fruition, and that this work has far-reaching significance in philosophy of science, methodology and epistemology, with respect to both history of philosophy and contemporary work in those areas. Working out the details of these implications is a collective undertaking, and "Closing the Loop" is an invaluable resource. It should be compulsory reading for anyone interested in the relationships between theory and empirical evidence, and in what kind of knowledge can be supported by the interplay between our theories and our experience of the world.

Smith begins with the familiar challenge to scientific knowledge from theory change, and in particular the shift from Newtonian gravitational theory to Einstein's general theory of relativity. Smith sets out to show exactly what two hundred years of stringent testing of Newton's theory achieved, epistemically, and why we would be mistaken to conclude that the shift from Newton to Einstein undermines the central knowledge claims. In this sense, it is a response to Kuhn.

The reason for including Smith's article in its entirety is that the philosophical and epistemological work is done by attention to the details of the science; so the article itself should be read in order to understand the philosophical import of what is being said. Nevertheless, there are some take-home messages that I will summarize here, which may perhaps serve as an invitation to read the article.

First of all, Newton's methodology, and the means by which his theory was tested over the ensuing centuries, was not hypothetico-deductive. A hypothetico-deductive methodology has three obvious short-comings: it does not test the high-risk assumption that all the relevant causal factors have been identified; relatedly, it cannot rule out alternative theories; and finally, it cannot deal systematically with discrepancies between theory and observations. Smith argues that the methodology in fact used by Newton and later astronomers was far more sophisticated, making powerful epistemic use of discrepancies between theory and observations to test for causal factors and rule out alternative theories (albeit fallibly, about which more below).

Secondly, the methodology explicitly allows for observational error: the statements that Newton makes based on the phenomena (such as his statement of Kepler's area law) are said to hold "quam proxime" rather than exactly, and the inferences that he draws from the phenomena are investigated in order to determine whether they continue to hold under slight deviations. According to Smith, this is crucial in Newton's development of a methodology designed to tackle the problem of underdetermination of theory by data.

Thirdly, and relatedly, the reasoning is modally rich. Newton requires that a theory give determinate answers to what would happen in a variety of counterfactual situations. This enables him to investigate the robustness of the theory under the approximations mentioned above. It also enables him to transform systematic discrepancies between theory and observation into a powerful epistemic resource: "every systematic discrepancy between observation and any result deduced from the theory ought to stem from a physical source not taken into consideration while deducing the result" (p. 275), and thus every systematic discrepancy is a clue to the existence of a causal factor not yet taken into account. Failure to find a physical source that can be accounted for within the resources of the theory is a problem for the theory, but successive incorporation of such discrepancies within the theoretical reach of the theory provides strong evidence for that theory. A significant portion of Smith's chapter goes through the details of how this unfolded for Newtonian gravitational theory in the three centuries following the publication of the Principia, thereby making vivid the richness and exact nature of the evidence that accrued for Newtonian gravitation. What we see is ever more detailed dependencies in the observable phenomena (this heretofore unrecognized detail in the motion of this planet over here is systematically related to these heretofore unrecognized details in the motions of these other celestial objects over here, for example), embedded in the modal dependencies captured by the theory (change the motion of this planet in this specific detailed way, and the motions of these other celestial bodies would change in these specific detailed ways).

What the development of Einstein's theories of relativity brings home is that despite its power and the strength of the evidence, the methodology remains fallible. In particular, Newton's theory of gravitation was built on evidence drawn primarily from our planetary system, and it turns out that this is "misleadingly parochial evidence" (p. 322) about gravity, because the gravitational field in our solar system is weak and approximately static. A range of different theories reproduce the evidence that supported Newtonian theory, and some of these (such as Einstein's theory of general relativity) are built on very different assumptions and yield very different results for gravitational fields that differ from the weak, approximately static field of our planetary system. This is the challenge of underdetermination, and of unconceived alternatives. What Smith's analysis shows, however, is that we need to be more sophisticated about the knowledge that we produce through the process of scientific theorizing, and to recognize that scientific theories are not "the product" of science, to be analyzed for how "true" or otherwise they are. Rather, they are one of the tools by which we generate scientific knowledge. The systematic dependencies in the phenomena of our planetary system, encoded in the modal dependencies of Newton's theory, remain in place when we move to Einstein's general theory of relativity: this knowledge gained about our planetary system remains intact. That statement is too vague to be meaningful, and I offer it as an invitation to read Smith's paper; he provides the details in section 10.4 of his chapter.

The conclusion that Smith argues for is that "philosophers and historians of science have indeed over-reacted in their response to the Einsteinian revolution" (p. 341). I think Smith makes a powerful case, and that working through the implications of this for our understanding of what constitutes scientific knowledge, and specifically the roles of theory in the constitution of scientific knowledge, is a task that his chapter makes pressing.

This book is a rich resource for those interested in Newton's engagement with and impact on the philosophical problems of his time, and on subsequent philosophy of science to the present day. Whether or not you have any prior knowledge of Newton's work, this collection is sure to contain something that will be of interest.